Death, Posthumous Harm, and Bioethics

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James Stacey Taylor, Death, Posthumous Harm, and Bioethics, Routledge, 2012, 228pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415518840.

Reviewed by Robert S. Olick, SUNY Upstate Medical University


Many well-established bioethical positions, laws and policies rest on the consensus view that it matters whether our future-oriented interests, plans, commitments and choices are honored not only in life but also after we die. This understanding rests in important ways (but by no means entirely) on the principle that a person is harmed or wronged when his previously expressed interests, plans, choices and rights fail, are thwarted or violated after death. Consider the prevailing autonomy-based approach to first-person consent to cadaveric organ donation, duties of confidentiality that survive the patient's death, ethical-legal issues surrounding genetic research with stored tissues, and disputes over posthumous disposition of gametes and frozen embryos. Other, time-honored practices in the moral life, where failure to respect our prior future-oriented autonomy after death harms us, include funeral and burial rites, testamentary wills, life insurance, philanthropic trusts, and various other ways people strive to control postmortem events and states of affairs and to shape their legacy and reputation.

In this volume James Stacey Taylor proffers a direct challenge to the concept of posthumous harm itself, and thus to a number of foundational bioethical positions. His argument is rooted in precepts of the ancient philosopher Epicurus who held that death is not a harm to the person who dies, as death marks the end of sensation, the limitation of experience. From this standpoint Taylor develops a contemporary Epicurean thanatological position intended to establish three connected propositions: "that death is not a harm to the person who dies, that posthumous harm is impossible, and that the dead cannot be wronged." (p. 2) The first four chapters are devoted to the second and third propositions; chapters five and six seek to establish the first proposition by developing Taylor's self-styled "full-blooded" hedonistic Epicureanism.

Taylor proceeds in a careful and systematic fashion. He presents and then critiques the views of various thinkers committed to the established position that the person who has died can be harmed or wronged by postmortem events or states of affairs. For Taylor there are two fundamental problems for all such accounts of posthumous harm. First, how can something that happens after death cause harm to someone before his death? (The problem of backwards causation.) Second, how can we speak of a person who no longer exists as being harmed or wronged when she cannot experience any adverse affect on her well-being? (The problem of the subject.) He concludes that none of the proponents of the posthumous harm consensus adequately respond to these philosophical dilemmas.

Taylor' s own position is grounded in a hedonistic conception of harmful events and states of affairs as those that result in the person's welfare being less than it was before or than it would have been had the event not occurred at all. From this posit, postmortem events cannot be understood to cause harm to someone who has died. Not wanting to discard our considered moral intuitions altogether, he offers an alternative account of what we (should) mean when we speak of posthumous harm, one that relies on the distinction between harm to a person and harm for him. He claims that he thereby avoids both of the dilemmas that plague the posthumous harm consensus. The last three chapters address what it would mean for select topics in bioethics to hold that posthumous harms/wrongs in the metaphysical, causal sense are impossible. Implications for debates about suicide and euthanasia, assisted posthumous reproduction, medical research on the dead and medical confidentiality are rather briefly addressed. The chapter "Epicureanism and Organ Procurement " is well-developed and the most compelling portion of the text from a bioethical perspective.

Those looking to probe the metaphysical question of posthumous harm more deeply or in search of critique of certain consensus views in bioethics will find this book an interesting and compelling read. Those unfamiliar with the philosophical terrain may find it advisable to first explore some of the leading interest-based (or similar) accounts of why posthumous harms and wrongs matter in the moral life (especially those noted in this volume) and of the place of respect for prospective autonomy in bioethics, before turning to Taylor's critical appraisal. The balance of this review summarizes key features of the author's argument with attention to what is most relevant to contemporary issues in bioethics addressed in the book.

Chapter one is foundational and sets the stage for subsequent analysis. The interest-based account of posthumous harm dominant in bioethics and elsewhere is presented and critiqued, focusing primarily on the work of Joel Feinberg and George Pitcher. As Taylor presents it, the starting point of the Feinberg-Pitcher view is the intuition: if a living person can be harmed by the thwarting of his interests, even if he does not know this has occurred, then it follows that these very same interests can be thwarted and the person harmed, even when this occurs after death when, by definition, the person cannot experience the event or state of affairs or the consequent harm. Consider years of hard work to invest in a college savings plan. If the (next) great recession depletes A's account and defeats his interests in providing for his children, unbeknownst to A, does it not follow that A is also harmed when these events occur after his death? For Pitcher postmortem events or states of affairs that adversely affect the important interests held by the person at some stage of life harm the antemortem person. Feinberg's position is similar and includes the possibility of posthumous wrong, e.g., when promises are broken (suppose A's funds were lost due to bank malfeasance) or reputations are tarnished after we die. Since the subject of the harm/wrong in question is the antemortem person, the problem of the subject and of backwards causation is avoided. Further, understanding posthumous harms/wrongs as the thwarting of interests, the breaking of promises or the violation of rights, all of which can continue as important concerns after death, does not demand that the antemortem person in fact experience being less well off as a result of the postmortem event. (pp. 12-13)

Taylor disagrees. While it is unproblematic, he argues, to retroactively ascribe certain properties to antemortem persons, such as having been a murderer when this is proven after one's death (an example from Dorothy Grover), it cannot be said that being less well off (known as a murderer) was caused by a posthumous event (proven to have been a murderer). This confuses, it is argued, descriptive and ethical properties with the metaphysical, causal property of harm. These are different sorts of retroactive ascriptions. On Taylor's view we cannot say the posthumous event caused harm without running afoul of the problem of backwards causation. Further, the lives of antemortem persons cannot be affected (made less well off) by postmortem events "so there is no clear basis on which to attribute harm to them." (p. 17)

Taylor's strategic stance is essential to his argument. He characterizes the intuitive position that persons can be harmed/wronged by postmortem events even though the event or state of affairs does not affect their experiences as "not uncontroversial." He proceeds (chapters 1-4 especially) to take up cases where posthumous harm seems quite plausible, then purports to show that these accounts fail to avoid the problems of backwards causation and of the subject. Invoking the principle that a simpler explanation of our intuitions is preferred to a more complex one (the principle of philosophical parsimony) he offers alternative explanations of our widely shared intuitions that are not, he argues, committed to the problematic possibility of posthumous harms/wrongs.

Such is the tone and tenor of chapter two, where Taylor summarizes different accounts of the possibility of posthumous harm advanced by other scholars, including that harm is best understood in terms of loss (Barbara Baum Levenbook), as impaired quality of life (Grover), or as being later implicated in evil (Paul Griseri).  He also summarizes Daniel Sperling's thesis that it is the human subject, not the antemortem person, who persists over time and can be posthumously harmed. Taylor critically assesses each of these in a fashion similar to his assessment of the Feinberg-Pitcher position. Chapter four has an extended discussion of posthumous wrongs. Consistent in his approach, Taylor refutes the close connection between interests, desires and rights (e.g., some rights promote our interests; we often have important interests in having our rights respected), and contends that postmortem violations of rights do not wrong the person who has died because the dead "have no rights to be violated." (p. 66) (Taylor presumably has ethical rights in mind here, as many legal rights are expressly intended to survive the death of the rights-holder, though on Taylor's view violation of such legal rights would not be a wrong to the person who has died.)

Chapter three asserts that posthumous harm is impossible, making the case for Taylor's "hedonistic account of well-being, on which a person's well-being will depend solely on the pleasures or pains that she experiences." (p. 39) On this ground posthumous harm is impossible -- seemingly by definition -- as one cannot be harmed by postmortem events in any causal sense of experiencing being less well off. How then to account for our intuitions that harm happens when a person's important projects fail after death? According to Taylor,

something is a harm to a person when it adversely affects his experiences. Such harms are harms proper; they are those harms that, when inflicted on a person, adversely affect his well-being. Something is a harm for a person when it thwarts his interests. (p. 74; emphasis in original)

Rephrased, the contention is that when a person's important projects fail postmortem, this is not a harm to her as her well-being is not affected by the project's failure; rather it is a harm for her insofar as the project's failure thwarts her interests and prevents a state of affairs she valued and sought to bring to fruition for reasons "independently of any considerations of her own well-being." (p. 44) For many of us this account will be unsatisfactory. Among other things, we have many interests and projects that are partly or wholly other-regarding in aim and purpose. They are nonetheless ours, and it is critical to our values, autonomy and identity when they fail. (Perhaps the distinction between harm to and harm for is a distinction without a difference). But for Taylor this distinction does important work in explaining our intuitions without being committed to backwards causation or experience of postmortem events.

Though posthumous harm and the harm of death itself are closely linked, it is still rational to simultaneously hold that posthumous harm is impossible but that death itself is a harm to the person who has died. Chapters five and six develop and defend Taylor's contemporary Epicurean view, aiming to show that death itself is not a harm to the person who has died and thereby to close this lacuna in the argument. The text expounds upon the posit that an event can only harm someone if it produces an adverse effect on the person's experiences; since the dead have no experiences, only antemortem persons can be harmed. Chapter six explores variations on the theme with an interesting discussion of whether events that occur prior to existence, for example, prenatal injury or the impoverishment of a parent, harms the later existing person.

To take Taylor's argument seriously is to weaken the principle of respect for prospective autonomy, but it does not demand that we abandon it. He acknowledges as much, stating at the outset that his views "will not directly support the drawing of many bold bioethical conclusions." (p. 3) Yet he is well aware that to fully embrace his position is to assault a justificatory pillar of the priority status given to postmortem respect for antemortem autonomy, which aims to control postmortem events and states of affairs. Further, with appeal to posthumous harm disallowed, the door is open to according greater weight to other competing concerns, such as utility and the welfare of others, and to support revisions of extant principle, policy and practice.

Bioethical implications of the thesis largely concern autonomy-based policies that presume refusal absent consent. These implications are most on display in chapter eight's discussion of organ procurement, a topic Taylor has written on extensively elsewhere. If posthumous harm is irrelevant, advocates of presumed refusal cannot appeal to harm caused by mistaken organ takings in the absence of consent to support an opt-in policy. Nor can it be said that mistaken takings are worse than mistaken non-takings under a presumed consent (opt-out) model. Posthumous harm matters not in either case; the argument for presumed refusal is considerably weakened. We should accord greater purchase to the utility of saving more lives. Why not move to presumed consent, or an organs market? That said, Taylor does not mean to trample the place of autonomy. His path to respect of autonomy is a policy of proceduralism, whereby persons' wishes regarding treatment of their bodies postmortem are recorded and given due consideration in bedside procurement decisions with the intent that the person's wishes be followed absent good reasons to the contrary. Yet, if prior refusal to donate is only as important as (or less important than) saving lives in the balancing of concerns, one wonders whether autonomous refusal would ever trump utility.

Much the same reasoning counsels us to abandon the idea of presumed refusal in our approaches to posthumous reproduction and research on the dead (chapter 9). With respect to each, rejection of posthumous harm permits greater hold for utility, the welfare of others, and other concerns to shape principle and policy, perhaps in favor of presumed consent, within a proceduralist framework that gives voice, but lesser decisional purchase, to prior autonomy.

In conclusion, Taylor's argumentative stance adds to the richness of engagement with the views of numerous scholars as the discussion moves from one intriguing thought experiment to the next. But to place the burden of persuasion on our widely shared intuitions and the considered arguments that support them is controversial. Typically the burden of persuasion rests not with established consensus positions but with their challengers. And as Taylor himself seems to recognize, more work is needed to bridge the gap between his metaphysical account of the impossibility of posthumous harm and our widely shared ethical and social understandings of this very possibility in the exercise of moral agency; so too the implications for extant bioethical positions, laws and policies. As an advocate and defender of the principle of respect for prospective autonomy and its critical place in decisions near the end of life, even when we cannot experience the failure and thwarting of our interests, plans and rights due to cognitive incapacity or death, I was not converted by the book's arguments. They were nonetheless provocative and weighty, and this volume makes an important contribution to the ongoing debate.