Todd May’s Death is the twelfth volume in Acumen’s The Art of Living series, which aims to bring philosophy to a wider audience by having philosophers draw on their personal reflections to stimulate their readers’ thoughts about life. Alas, given the current lamentable state of popular philosophy (which often seems to be more concerned with the love of money than the love of wisdom) Acumen’s entry into this area might not be greeted with widespread delight. This reception is unlikely to improve on first encountering the titles of some of the volumes that have already been published in this series, which include those addressing such pressing philosophical issues as Pets, Clothes, Fame, Sex, and Sport.
Reading May’s Death, however, makes it abundantly clear that one should not judge a book series by the titles of the volumes that are contained within it — or by the fact that it has a popular focus. Death exemplifies how popular philosophy should be done. It is a thoughtful, engaging, and carefully written reflection on the nature of death and what our response to it, as mortals who are aware that we will die, should be. Moreover, although it is aimed at a general audience Death is also likely to be of interest to philosophers who are professionally engaged with the questions that it addresses. May’s philosophical range is broad, and so this book could profitably be used as an introduction to Ancient, Anglo-American, Continental, and Eastern views on death for persons unfamiliar with one or more of these traditions.
Death is divided into three sections of approximately 40 pages each: “Our dealings with death”, “Death and immortality”, and “Living with death”. The volume closes with suggestions for further reading and a short reference section. May begins the first section by bolding claiming that “the fact that we die is the most important fact about us”, for death structures a person’s life more than any other fact about it insofar as everything that we do occurs against the knowledge that we will someday die (p.4). May distinguishes this claim from the related claim that the importance of traumatic events in general lies in their tendency to lead us to address the questions of “what makes a life meaningful or worthwhile, or on the contrary saps life of meaning?” (p.10). Given the importance of death for both structuring our lives and contributing (qua a traumatic event) to their meaningfulness (or otherwise) it is not surprising that death has played a significant role in many religious traditions — including those that claim that we do not die, but continue to exist in some form of afterlife. After briefly canvassing both Christian and Buddhist approaches to keeping death at bay, May notes that while the underlying assumption of Death “is that one does not survive one’s death” (p. 19) this should not preclude persons with religious convictions from engaging with death, for faith and doubts about the dogmas of that faith can coexist.
May next reflects on the nature of death. Drawing on Heidegger’s Being and Time May considers four themes: that “death is the end of us and our experience”; that “that end is not an accomplishment or a goal; it is simply a stoppage”; that death is both “inevitable and uncertain”; and that these three characteristics of death “make us wonder whether there is any meaning to our lives” (p.22). After noting that the finality of death was the aspect that Christianity and Buddhism strove to overcome, May considers the alternative, Epicurean response: that we should take comfort from the fact that it consists of our annihilation. After criticizing Epicurus on the grounds that he reduces life to a series of pleasures and pains, May observes that many persons want their lives to have a point, to hold some meaning or significance rather than merely being enjoyable. This meaning could be gained from creating one’s life as a work of art with an integral balance to it, like a great novel or a painting, or it could be gained from contributing to the lives of others. But, May holds, death will frustrate these projects of giving life meaning, both because it is simply a stoppage, frustrating the striving towards balance in the life it ends, and because contributing to others’ lives matters little if their lives are no more meaningful than one’s own. Since recognition of these aspects of our lives will provoke anguish in us, we might recoil from death in one of two ways. We might wish to revert to being something with a lesser cognitive capacity so that we reduce death’s power within our lives, even if not over them, or we might come to desire immortality as a cure for death.
Noting that “the prospect of becoming something different from a human being, with full human consciousness, is one that few of us would endorse as a salve for the recognition of our mortality”, May turns in the second chapter of Death to consider whether being immortal would give our lives meaning or make us better off. May’s answer to these questions is a resounding “No”. Drawing on the plight of Cartaphilus from Borges’ short story “The Immortal”, May claims that “Given an infinite amount of time for existence, everything will happen of its own accord. There is nothing that an immortal being cannot eventually do; and, in fact, nothing he or she will not eventually do” (p.46). Thus, even if immortals are physically vigorous and able to develop emotionally and intellectually, immortality would not be worth having for persons who are aware of themselves as immortals. May argues that “When there is time for everything it is hard to make anything matter” (p.62). Following Nussbaum, he also argues that immorality would undermine many of the virtues: Courage would be absent, since it would be impossible to risk one’s life, while the needs of others would not press upon us in the same way for “their existence would not be threatened by our neglect” (p.62). Furthermore, he claims, immortality would weaken personal relationships. Since less would be at stake, they would become less serious, with friendships being limited by the lessening of sacrifices one immortal could make for another. And, claims May, an immortal life would be shapeless, eventually becoming just a string of events without any form. There is, then, a peculiar tension in our thinking about death. On one hand we (Epicureans aside) believe that death is an evil for us; on the other hand, if what May writes in this context is true, we should not try to flee this perceived evil by seeking immortality. How, then, are we to live with death? May addresses this question in the third chapter of Death, drawing on a Taoist approach to death. On this view there is no self, but simply the unfolding process of the cosmos", while “[e]ach of us is like a wave on the sea of being” (p.81). From this, May argues that perhaps one way to view our own death is to place it into a larger perspective, with our death coming to have a meaning, or a purpose, within this larger pattern in virtue of its clearing the way for others to come. Given this, argues May, we should learn to live within the knowledge that life is fragile.
While May’s approach to the issues that he addresses is always careful and thoughtful, it is not always persuasive. In particular, it seems that he has rather too quickly accepted Borges’ views concerning the disvalue of immortality. First, it is not obvious that immortality would undermine many of the virtues. Surely we could be courageous in the face of things other than our own demise, e.g., public humiliation or embarrassment. (Indeed, if we were immortal maybe avoiding such unpleasant occurrences would be even more important than it would be to a mortal — being known forever as the man who did that thing could be worse than the possibility that a faux pas would be remembered only for a few years before its extinction.) Moreover, the mere fact that others’ existences could not be threatened by our neglect does not show that we can have no duties towards them, for we might still strive to make their lives better — as the fate of the immortal in Borges’ story who fell into a quarry and spent seventy years “burning with thirst” before anyone threw him a rope to get out seems to show. Similarly, even if an immortal cannot sacrifice his life for his friends this does not show that their friendship is not a genuine one; that few mortals are ever given the chance to do this does not show that their friendships are shallower than they might at first think. Finally, it is not obvious that an immortal life would be one in which everything would eventually be done, as May believes. If an immortal person is simply a human who will never die, she will be subject to many of the same limitations on her abilities as her mortal counterpart would be: her body type will affect her athletic ability, and her intellect will determine the bounds of her cognitive capacities. But, if this is so, then it is not true that “There is nothing that an immortal being cannot eventually do; and, in fact, nothing he or she will not eventually do”. Indeed, if May is truly concerned with the possible ennui that an immortal will face on realizing the (putative) absence of any real challenges in life, surely then he should also recognize that the challenge that such ennui presents to one who has to overcome it to live a meaningful immortal life means that it carries with it the seeds of its own elimination?We might, then, try to dissolve the tension between the claims that death is an evil to us and that immortality is undesirable by making immortality desirable. Or we could try to show, with Epicurus, that the former claim is mistaken, and that death is instead “nothing to us”. May’s Death, then, is not the last word in the conversation. This is only appropriate for a volume in a series intended to lead people to engage intelligently and constructively with the issues that it addresses — a series which, judging by May’s contribution to it, will achieve this end with aplomb.