Debates in Indian Philosophy: Classical, Colonial, and Contemporary

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A. Raghuramaraju, Debates in Indian Philosophy: Classical, Colonial, and Contemporary, Oxford University Press, 2006, 139pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195671511.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, University of Newcastle


The Indian philosophical tradition has been overlooked by Western commentators for too long. Most especially, there is a particular neglect of contemporary Indian philosophy. When we think of 'Indian philosophy' in general, what often comes to mind is only classical Indian thought. Chiefly, we think of the Vedic period (the Vedas and the Upsanisads) and the Epic period (the Bhagavad Gītā in the Mahābhārata, The Laws of Manu, and Kautilya's Artha-śstraā), writings that were produced roughly between 600 (or earlier) BC and 200 A.D. Whilst a rich philosophical tradition continued afterwards -- giving us various schools of Jain, Buddhist, and Advainta Vedanta thought -- this receives far less attention than what little is given to the more classical Indian philosophical texts. Contemporary work in Indian philosophy escapes notice in the West altogether.

This presents us with a growing problem. Our world continues to get smaller. Political philosophers once spoke chiefly about justice within the state: now work on global justice is in ascendancy. Western philosophers in all areas continue to make great progress in thinking about philosophy beyond their borders. The primary defect is its complete failure to engage at all with philosophies beyond their borders. We speak of reasonableness in terms no one might reasonably reject from within our tradition, without considering how such views might be received within other traditions. To claim that the future of philosophy -- at least in areas such as global justice -- will lie in a greater engagement with non-Western philosophies is too certain to be a prophecy.

When we do begin engaging with other traditions, such as those developed in India, we quickly find our efforts rather fruitful. The dynamism, complexity, and interchange between canonical figures we enjoy in the Western tradition are no less present in the Indian philosophical tradition. We have much we can learn. What the Indian philosophical tradition might teach us extends far beyond simply developing our understanding of the philosophy of religion more genuinely, although this is also the case.

Perhaps the main reason the Indian philosophical tradition has escaped notice in the West is in part because what little was known was considered 'religious,' not 'philosophical,' and 'classical,' not 'contemporary.' (In fact, Raghuramaraju notes that only recently did the Journal of Indian Philosophy change its editorial policy and begin publishing work on Indian philosophy beyond its classical period (28).) Despite the appearance of many important contemporary figures in the Indian literature, we unfortunately have difficulty finding them in the Western literature.

Raghuramaraju has written a most wonderful book meant to introduce contemporary Indian philosophy to the West, while making a contribution to Indian philosophy as well. He divides the book essentially into three main chapters that examine key debates between two major thinkers. In each case study, Raghuramaraju seeks to not only explain what a major figure on each side of the debate sought to say, but also to clarify the nature of their disagreement, sometimes in disagreement with recent work in India on these topics. Thus, he attempts to make contribution beyond simply introducing us to important persons and ideas.

The first major chapter examines India's relationship with colonialism, comparing Swami Vivekananda and Mahatma Gandhi. Vivekananda is said to defend a more accommodating position with the West. That is, he recognizes both the existence and extent of India's poverty due to its lack of economic development, while celebrating India's spiritual past. The way forward is to modernize, but without sacrificing India's spiritual heritage. For example, he says:

Material civilization … is necessary to create work for the poor. Bread! Bread! I do not believe in a God, who cannot give me bread here, giving me eternal bliss in heaven! Pooh! India is to be raised, the poor are to be fed (43).

Vivekananda believes India has much to learn from the West in terms of economic development. However, India can give something back: spiritual development to the West. He says: 'If we have to learn from them the ways and methods of making ourselves happy in this life, why, in return, should we not give them the methods and ways that would make them happy for all eternity?' (47). A balance can be struck in a mutually beneficial relationship whereby a materialist West can bring economic development to the East and a spiritual East can bring religious development to the West.

This view is challenged by Mahatma Gandhi, who denied that materialism and spirituality could be brought together in a harmonious way. Gandhi argued that what characterized modern civilization is its replacement of God with materialism (51). Thus, modern civilization is not merely incompatible with spirituality, but, in truth, 'Satanic' (51). Materialism, for Gandhi, did not merely oppress non-Western societies, but it also oppressed Western societies. Thus, like Vivekananda, Gandhi associates materialism with the West and spirituality with the East, but where they part is Gandhi's rejection of materialism.

The second major chapter focuses on religion and politics, again looking at Mahatma Gandhi, but contrasting his views on this topic with V. D. Savarkar and his ideology of Hindutva. Savarkar distinguishes 'Hinduism' from 'Hindutva.' Hinduism is a religion. Hindutva is not religion, but personal: it is a community of persons who share a pre-British and pre-Islamic history, who speak Hindi, who are Hindus, and enjoy 'a common culture and law' (78). Curiously, Savarkar argued that those who are Hindutva should join the British Indian army. Their task was not to help the British, but rather to acquire military training they could not acquire otherwise in order to eventually drive the British from India (see 79-80). There is, thus, a militancy about the Hindutva ideology that is modern, not classical.

Gandhi shares with Savarkar the view that religion and politics should be interwined. Where they part views is on the fact that Gandhi believes that political power is a means (namely, to reform), rather than an end. He says:

If then I want political power, it is for the sake of the reforms for which the Congress stands. Therefore, when the energy to be spent in gaining that power means so much loss of energy required for the reforms, as threatened to be the case if the country is to engage in a duel with the Mussalmans or Sikhs, I would most decidedly advise the country to let the Mussalmans and Sikhs take all the power and I would go on with developing the reforms (85).

Politics can serve useful ends, but it is only an instrument by which we may enjoy such ends. Moreover, Gandhi's religious thought held Hinduism as a religion of love, not political might, in keeping with a doctrine of non-violence. Thus, while Gandhi may have wanted to spiritualize politics, he rejected Savarkar's militant views on politicizing spirituality.

The third and final major chapter compares Sri Aurobindo and Krishnachandra Bhattacharyya on science and spirituality. Sri Aurobindo argued that (materialist) science was compatible with Hindu spirituality. Hinduism often downplays the physical world as a sphere of illusion, or maya, turning its focus instead on an eternal beyond this world. Materialist science is incomplete, yet complements this traditional Indian picture. Where this picture is lacking, science can fill its gaps and vice versa. He says:

The mistake made by European materialism is to suppose the basis to be everything and confuse it with the source. The source of life and energy is not material, but spiritual, but the basis, the foundation on which the life and energy stand and work, is physical (98).

Both East and West have much to gain from combining their understandings of the world.

Bhattacharyya disagrees. He argues that science views its objects as 'knowable and usable,' whereas our true 'spiritual demand is that nature should be contemplated and not merely used or manipulated' (105). Reality is something more than what we can measure. Science denies the presence of what we cannot measure, a metaphysics beyond matter. This view is captured well by Tagore: 'Truth is the infinite pursued by metaphysics; fact is the infinite pursued by science' (112n3).

The book concludes with a magnificent closing chapter that contemplates the future for Indian philosophy. One thing many readers will note is that while the various figures discussed offer a variety of interesting and exciting claims, these claims are not particularly rigorously argued. Raghuramaraju is well aware of this problem, claiming that the lack of rigor is particular to contemporary Indian philosophy and not classical Indian philosophy (see 118). It is easy to get a real sense from this chapter that colonialism damaged India, not least its self-confidence and flourishing philosophical tradition. The good news is that this tradition lives on with new figures and new ideas, often building off of India's intellectual past, but also in combination with imported Western ideas. In this sense, contemporary Indian philosophy is ahead of its Western counterparts in forging an awareness and possibility for a common ground.

Despite my strong praise of Raghuramaraju's work and complete endorsement of his greater project (i.e., bringing Indian and Western philosophy into greater contact with one another), this should not prevent my voicing a few critical remarks about Debates in Indian Philosophy.

My first criticism is that the focus is entirely on Indian philosophers who are Hindu. This gives the misleading impression that Hindu philosophers are the only figures of importance in contemporary Indian debates. Nothing could be further from the truth: contemporary Indian philosophy is as diverse as ever. Of course, I recognize that no book can cover every topic and figure. However, I was very surprised to find no mention at all of B. R. Ambedkar, a Buddhist convert who studied with John Dewey at Columbia and returned to India, widely credited with being the drafter of India's constitution.

A second criticism is that perhaps the two Hindu writers most worthy of inclusion were excluded: Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan and Rabindranath Tagore. Perhaps other than Mahatma Gandhi (who receives ample attention), few other Indian writers have received greater attention in the West than Radhakrishnan and Tagore. Radhakrishnan was well versed in both Western and Indian traditions, working with the British Idealist John Henry Muirhead, including a co-edited book, Contemporary Indian Philosophy, published in 1952. Tagore is cited often in Raghuramaraju's notes supporting the views of less well known contemporary figures. However, it is a pity Tagore's words did not merit greater attention in the main text, given his phenomenal influence on Indian thought at his time and afterwards.

Third, I believe Raghuramaraju could have made the book more accessible to a Western audience. Whilst his summaries are excellent and I think he chose wisely to include many extended remarks from Indian figures (whose work may otherwise be quite unknown to the West), these passages convey a number of important concepts that prevail in Indian philosophy, but are largely unknown in the West, such as kharma, maya, mukti, samkara, and others. The Western reader would have benefited greatly from some explanation of these terms either in the chapters where they arise or in a glossary.

These criticisms should not detract from how strongly I recommend this book to anyone with an interest in expanding their horizons and exploring the development of current Indian philosophical thought. I have profited from its pages. As our world continues to shrink, an engagement with other philosophical traditions will become ever more necessary. Perhaps it will take one of our finest Western moral and political philosophers to bring Indian philosophy to the centre of our attention: indeed, Martha C. Nussbaum has begun doing just this for many years and increasingly so.

Raghuramaraju's Debates in Indian Philosophy is the first of what I hope will be many steps in this project of bringing Western and Indian philosophies into conversation with each other. He does admirably well in this task and his book is a tremendous achievement. I recommend it without reservation. Let us hope that much more is to follow.