Debates in the Metaphysics of Time

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L. Nathan Oaklander (ed.), Debates in the Metaphysics of Time, Bloomsbury, 2014, 293pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781780934907.

Reviewed by Ulrich Meyer, Colgate University


This volume consists of thirteen papers that comprise five "debates" of two or three papers each. The debates focus on views in the philosophy of time that were recently defended by one of the participants, and cover a fairly broad spectrum of issues that ranges from the phenomenology of temporal perception to God's relation to time. Since there is little overlap among the debates, it seemed best to say a little bit about each of them, so as to give potential readers an overview of the topics discussed and the positions defended.

Yuval Dolev's Time and Realism

The first three papers are about themes from Yuval Dolev's Time and Realism (MIT Press, 2007). Dolev's central thesis, which he defends in Chapter 4 of his book, is that the debate between tensed and tenseless theories of time is a pseudo-problem generated by a misuse of the word 'real'. L. Nathan Oaklander's contribution to the present volume ("Dolev's Anti-Metaphysical Realism: A Critique") focuses on the discussion in Chapters 1-3, where Dolev argues that the debate between tensed and tenseless theories of time has reached a stalemate. Oaklander contends that Dolev assumes a false dichotomy, and that he fails to consider a third alternative, which Oaklander calls the B/R-theory of time. But this new theory seems to be little more than an old theory of time -- Russellian event-relationism -- together with a revamped account of temporal phenomenology. Dolev ("Motion and Passage: The Old B-Theory and Phenomenology") argues that the B/R Theory does not fare any better than its competitors, and then offers a fresh defense of his view that an investigation of temporal phenomenology should precede any temporal ontology.

Franceso Orilia ("Two Metaphysical Perspectives on the Duration of the Present") focuses on what happens after Chapter 4 of Dolev's book. Orilia argues that the account of the duration of the present that Dolev defends in Chapter 5 commits him to eternalism, which is an ontological thesis. If that is right, then Dolev's phenomenology-inspired post-ontological philosophy of time might not be all that post-ontological after all. This is an interesting point, and it would have been helpful if the volume had contained a reply by Dolev to Orilia's objection, and not only his replies to Oaklander.

The Passage of Time

Unlike the other parts of the book, the next three papers do not address one another but evolve on parallel tracks. Erwin Tegtmeier ("Temporal Succession and Tense") explores Russell's and McTaggart's views about time, but does not appear to offer a positive view of his own, and makes little contact with the recent literature on the philosophy of time.

M. Oreste Fiocco ("Becoming: Temporal, Absolute and Atemporal") argues that all extant views of the nature of time fail to account for the novelty of the present. To account for this missing element, he proposes a notion of absolute becoming, according to which moments of time come into and then go out of existence. He does not tell us what moments are, but he is adamant that their nature is such that they cannot undergo intrinsic change, and that their coming into and going out of existence cannot be a temporal process. The latter claim follows from Fiocco's view that all objects that cannot change must exist outside time altogether. However, it is not clear that moments can really come into existence without coming into existence at some time. The worry here is the same as in the more general puzzle of change. Unless we can relativize existence claims to different times, we end up with the contradictory claim that any moment both exists and does not exist. One might also doubt that there really is a problem of novelty that philosophers of time need to solve. The novelty of the present is not a feature of the present moment, one might argue, but a feature of what happens at that time. What makes each time novel is that it contains experiences that were not had at earlier times.

Joshua Mozersky ("Temporal Predicates and the Passage of Time") argues that all there is to the passage of time is the occurrence of change, or the temporal succession of events. He argues that this account does everything one could want an account of passage to do, and that metaphysically more ambitious accounts are untenable. This is similar to a view that I myself have defended, so I am inclined to agree with Mozersky on this point.

Barry Dainton on Phenomenal Integration

The three papers in this debate are about Barry Dainton's view that what turns a succession of experiences into a unified stream of consciousness is phenomenal overlap. Such a mereological account of phenomenal integration requires that our temporal experiences are temporally extended, and that is the point where the two critics attack.

Michael Pelczar ("Physical Time, Phenomenal Time, and the Symmetry of Nature") claims that basic experiences must be instantaneous. If experiences were temporally extended, Pelczar argues, then the laws of experience could not be time-reversal invariant like all of our basic physical theories. Suppose we have a sequence of overlapping, temporally extended visual experiences (A-B), (B-C), (C-D) of an object moving continuously through point A, B, C, and D. By reversing the temporal order of these extended experiences, we get (C-D), (B-C), (A-B), which is not the experience of a continuous motion from D to A, but an observation of a weird jumping back and forth. Since this problem only arises for temporally extended experiences, Pelczar takes this as an argument in favor of instantaneous basic experiences. If that is right, though, then we cannot offer a mereological account of phenomenal integration across time because instantaneous experiences can only overlap if they are simultaneous.

Dainton's reply ("Flows, Repetitions, and Symmetries: Replies to Lee and Pelczar") is long and somewhat tentative, and culminates in doubting, by appeal to recent experimental data, that physical processes really have this symmetry. I think there is a better reply to Pelczar that he might have given instead. What it means to say that physical theories are time-reversal invariant is that, given any solution to the equations of motion, we get another solution to these equations if we flip the sign of the time variable (substitute t with -t) and also reverse the orientation of all velocities (substitute v with -v). Pelczar seems to overlook the latter condition. Dainton could plausibly argue that his temporally extended experiences are relevantly similar to velocities in that they represent features of short time intervals, and that they should therefore transform in the same way. But if the temporal orientation of experiences gets reversed like that of velocities, then the time-reversal of our sequence of experiences is (D-C), (C-B), (B-A), and Dainton no longer has a problem.

Geoffrey Lee ("Extensionalism, Atomism, and Continuity") defends atomism, according to which experiences have content that is temporally extended, but do not themselves contain shorter experiences as temporal parts, again ruling out temporal overlap. Lee also suggests a causal account of phenomenal integration to take the place of Dainton's mereological account. Lee's main argument in support of atomism is empirical: he claims that this is how the brain works. Dainton responds by arguing that Lee fails to solve the repetition problem. In a succession of atomic experiences with temporally extended content, there is overlap of content, but there is no such repetition of content ("stuttering") in our experiences. Lee claims that such repetitions are undetectable, invisible to introspection. Dainton replies that there is no empirical reason to think that there is such a repression of content. I am inclined to side with Dainton on this issue. Even though causal accounts of phenomenal integration will strike many readers as very attractive (myself included), more needs to be said about how they would solve the repetition problem.

Brian Leftow on God's Eternity

The papers by Joseph Diekemper ("Divine Events") and Brian Leftow ("Instants, Events, and God") are about the old question of whether God exists at all times (sempiternally), or outside time altogether (eternally). The focus here is on how this debate relates to the question of whether there are any instantaneous events. In earlier work, Leftow had appealed to instantaneous events to explain what an eternal God would be like, by construing existence outside time as instantaneous existence at an eternal time point. Diekemper attacks this account by arguing against instantaneous events. Events are changes, he claims, and changes take time. But if all events are temporally extended, and if God participates in some of them, then He must be temporal as well. Diekemper further supports this view by appeal to Scripture. If we are made in the image of God, he reasons, then His mental life should be similar to ours, and take the form of a succession of temporally extended mental events. Having argued for a sempiternal God, Diekemper then turns to a problem for his own position, namely the old question of what God did before creating the world, and why He did not create it, say, five minutes earlier. Diekemper's novel solution is that, prior to creation, God took some time -- and perhaps infinitely long -- to savor the delightful anticipation of performing the great act of creating the world.

In his response, Leftow denies that it would have taken a being like God this much time to enjoy the anticipation of His creation, and he outlines a view of divine psychology on which His entire mental life is instantaneous. This does not mean that we were not created in His image, he claims; it merely serves to illustrate God's greatness. What we need extended periods of time to accomplish, He can do in a flash. Leftow then proceeds to refute the arguments against instantaneous events offered by Diekemper. What is peculiar about Diekemper's arguments, though, is that they do not try to show the impossibility of instantaneous events, only that we can do without them. At the end of the debate, we therefore seem to arrive at a draw. We have two rival theories about God's mental life, both of which can be squared with Scripture and an account of events. To some extent, this is a reassuring result: who would have thought that the central issue in God's relation to time is whether there are instantaneous events? On the other hand, this might also make the whole debate look a little bit uninteresting.

Katherin Roger's Anselm on Freedom

The last two papers are about the eternalist solution to the problem of free will and divine omniscience that Katherin Roger defends in Anselm on Freedom (Oxford, 2008). In a nutshell, Roger's view is that humans can freely perform certain actions, and that God knows what these actions are. But God exists outside time and thus does not foreknow human free actions before they are performed. Moreover, it is the freely performed human actions that determine what God knows atemporally, not the other way around.

Alan Rhoda ("Foreknowledge and Fatalism: Why Divine Timelessness Doesn't Help") raises two objections to Roger's proposal. The first is that the knowledge state of an eternal God cannot depend on the free choices that humans make in time. This would require His epistemic state to change in time, along with human choices, thus turning Him into a temporal being. Roger responds ("Foreknowledge Dilemma: Response to Rhoda") that it is a mistake to think that the temporality of an agent's choosing would be inherited by God's knowing of the agent's deliberation and choice. Compare this to knowledge about the past: we know about Caesar's choosing to cross the Rubicon, but that does not turn us into denizens of the first century BC. An eternal perspective on the time series would be a little bit like viewing it from an infinitely future point, and would not require the eternal knower to mirror the temporal features of the known.

Rhoda's second objection is that Roger's assumption that all times are equally real prevents human freedom, and leads to fatalism. As Rhoda uses the term, 'fatalism' amounts to the claim that the future is causally determined. Roger might indeed think that the future is as fixed as the past, but that alone does not commit her to causal determinism. It seems perfectly conceivable that past, present, and future are equally real, but that there are no causal relations between the events that occur in time. In any case, Roger can easily admit that free actions are causally determined, as long as they are determined in the right sort of Anselmian way, by being caused by the agent's character.

In sum, the book covers a lot of ground, but often does so in a narrowly focused way, by concentrating on specific issues that emerge in the context of a particular author's work. It might not be suited as an introduction to the philosophy of time, but it contains much material that will be of interest to those who are already familiar with the dialectical landscape in this area of philosophy.