Debating Brain Drain: May Governments Restrict Emigration?

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Gillian Brock and Michael Blake, Debating Brain Drain: May Governments Restrict Emigration?, Oxford University Press, 2015, 304pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199315628.

Reviewed by Avery Kolers, University of Louisville


Supposedly, transnational migration benefits all sides. The migrant exercises her freedom to move and pursues her conception of the good. The receiving country gets the human-capital boost. The global economy benefits from the more efficient deployment of resources. The source country reduces unemployment by one, while typically benefiting from remissions sent 'home' by the migrant. There is plenty of empirical research that bears all this out, and academic philosophers have principally addressed transnational migration under the assumption that this picture is more or less accurate. At its extreme this orientation leads to a moral ultimatum facing wealthy countries: they may either open their borders, or pay significantly more development aid, but they must do one or the other in the name of fighting global poverty. The assumption is that open borders can be a form of development aid.

It's true that immigration can be a form of development aid, but there is reason to believe the principal benefit goes the other way.[1] Large-scale asymmetric migration flows as we know them today -- from the Global South to the Global North -- constitute a major transfer of human capital from the impoverished countries to the wealthy ones. While migrants come from all sectors of society, this transfer is most dispiriting when the migrants are the most highly and expensively trained members of the society, with the most human and social capital. This "Brain Drain" devastates small countries with small budgets that cannot churn out doctors or nurses fast enough to replace the outflow. As Gillian Brock reports, the numbers are staggering:

[I]n 2001 Ghana lost five hundred nurses, which is more than double the number of new nurses graduated that year. About a third to a half of South African medical school graduates emigrate to the developed world, and about half the physicians trained in Ghana between 1985 and 1994 have left the country. . . . [Authors] estimate the fiscal cost of the brain drain for India as roughly 2.5 percent of Indian fiscal revenues, or 0.5 percent of the Indian GDP. (38)

This Brain Drain thus may add a significant gradient to the already steep hill that developing countries have to climb in order to meet their obligations to their populations. Brock describes three kinds of losses suffered by "those left behind" as a result:

(1)  Purely financial loss (such as costs of training, loss of tax revenue);

(2)  Loss of skills and services; and

(3)  Loss of institution-building assets.

While she grants that emigration can also bring benefits to the source country, Brock thinks that the balance is often unfavorable, and while losses of types 1 and 2 are serious blows, it is losses of type 3 that most risk "undermin[ing] the fundamental features necessary to sustain . . . robust institutions and effective states" (45). Since robust institutions and effective states are a necessary condition of justice (26-28), type 3 losses threaten to undermine any hope of justice in developing countries.

But suppose we grant that the Brain Drain is costly in these ways; is it ever permissible for a state to adopt a policy of coercively stopping people from leaving, thus conscripting them into the cause of promoting justice at home? The two co-authors differ on this question. Brock's reply is a very qualified "yes," while Michael Blake's is a regretful but firm "no." Blake recognizes that the brain drain may produce or exacerbate the current global order's massive and even "tragic" injustice; but he denies that states may therefore prevent their citizens from leaving. Exit and renunciation of citizenship are basic rights.

His straightforward argument is written in the engaging style for which he is well known. We all have a duty to decrease global injustice. This duty does not fall more heavily on those who were born and raised in impoverished countries than it does on the rest of us. Yet preventing them from leaving -- while leaving unmolested those of luckier birth -- maldistributes the duty (135). In addition, the right to leave is a fundamental human right and a core element of liberalism (112). Even if someone promised or contracted with their government to stay, it would be wrong to hold them to this along the lines of a specific-performance requirement (178). All the more so because it is not at all clear that attempting to stop the Brain Drain would have the desired effects; to the contrary, it might lead to "Brain Waste" (167) -- whereas emigration itself might generate "Brain Gain," even in the countries that are losing the most (161). The empirical considerations are murky. Yet when push comes to shove, Blake argues, even if they did all point in one direction, it would still be wrong to coercively prevent would-be emigrants from leaving. Even holding them for a single day would be too much. The only possible condition under which it might be permissible to do so is under extreme emergency, and even then only if absolutely necessary to achieve basic liberties; and even then, one should never announce that one was doing this (195).

Brock builds up her argument for the affirmative somewhat more methodically. She argues that effective states are necessary for justice, and these require functional institutions. Currently there are a number of states that are genuinely burdened: in each there is a "legitimate government of a poor, developing country [which] attempts to address and provide for its citizens' needs in a responsible way" (60). Quite apart from the flagrant injustices perpetrated by wealthy governments, what may such a "responsible, but poor" government do to solve its own problems? Given the empirical realities catalogued above, such a government might reasonably seek means of stanching the flow of highly skilled emigrants, since their skills are needed at home to save lives and build just institutions.

Brock argues that such a government might justly take a variety of measures to regulate or slow -- though not outright prevent -- the departure of emigrating highly skilled graduates. These measures could be more or less restrictive, in "felt" terms or in reality, and she does not imagine that they would ever be permanent: a year in an underserved area as a condition of receiving the medical degree, for instance, or a "Bhagwati tax" on emigrants' income (61). She is not defending a Berlin Wall, but in fact proposing stratagems of sorts that wealthy countries themselves engage in all the time, albeit with much less justification. Still, ultimately her claim comes down to the negation of Blake's: preventing people from leaving is not always unjust. The question is why.

Brock proposes a number of powerful moral arguments (65-68). Suppose prospective students are offered a package deal, say, tuition-for-service; if they don't like the package they can leave it. They have no antecedent right to the training in question. By hypothesis, the "responsible but poor" government is sufficiently just that contracts with it are valid. Hence, under such terms graduates do have contractual obligations to stay. Even if they don't sign such a contract, the acceptance of benefits generates a moral package deal in the form of duties of gratitude, fair play, or loyalty. Further, the training in question consumes precious funds from the responsible government of a burdened society. Such a sacrifice of scarce taxpayer dollars can be justified only as part of a project to benefit those taxpayers. A government is not entitled to give away money for no reason. Educational expenditures are justified as investments, not as charity, and so such a government -- responsible, but poor -- has a right to a fair return on that investment, in the form of the human capital thereby produced. Moreover, by taking the money and running, the graduate actively imposes a harm on the remaining population, by "thwarting" the state's effort to discharge its own duties.

In the bulk of their contributions, Brock and Blake develop their arguments at considerable length and with considerable insight. Though they recognize some scope for agreement (275-76), in the end there is the fundamental disagreement: can even the most just society have a right to hold even a single innocent person for even a single minute, if that person wants to leave? Brock's reply is that, while it is always better for agents' preferences to be harnessed rather than coerced, the backstop coercion can indeed be justified. Blake's reply is that, even if individuals might incur moral obligations or debts to their governments, the state simply may not hold them, for even a minute, against their will. That states do this all the time is no excuse.

A good for-and-against volume sheds light on a genuinely difficult and important problem in a way that connects that problem to the broad scope of issues in the field, illuminating the problem itself while also reaching insights for the field in general. Further, such a volume should feature authors who are far enough apart that their debate is of broad interest, but close enough together that they are not talking past each other.

The current volume features authors whose basic moral commitments are close to identical: they are both broadly Rawlsian liberals, their visions of a just world order basically aligned. One might have hoped for a bit more divergence, whether from a more statist or communitarian right, or a more radical left. Nonetheless, despite the authors' near agreement on ideal-theoretic issues, there is no shortage of differences here, since their greatest divergence is not normative but methodological; notwithstanding his fallback to "marginal improvement" (227), Blake seems more reliant on principles directly derived from "ideal-theory" liberalism, whereas Brock thinks that nonideal circumstances can generate genuine moral obligations. As a result the volume raises deep metaphilosophical questions. And ironically, if the authors had disagreed more sharply on the focal question, the volume could probably not have been as interesting on the methodological issues.

These deep and difficult questions of philosophical methodology are, however, not addressed at length in their own right. This is perhaps inevitable, but there are real costs. Blake's contribution seems to be somewhat more problematic in this respect. For instance, he ultimately worries that the circumstances of global justice simply are not met, because the world is "spectacularly unjust" (224); indeed, the brain drain can arise as a problem only under such massive injustice. Yet "we cannot work against this injustice through justified means; we are in a world that is not simply unjust, but tragic" (227).

Blake admits that this conclusion is "deeply unsatisfying" (225), but the worry is that it seems to come too quickly to be warranted, principally, I think, because Blake does not deal seriously with the challenge of nonideal theory or of ethics for man-made disasters such as the public health crisis in Malawi or South Africa. This has consequences, for instance, when he proposes that in conditions of dire poverty we will "discover that political malfeasance is often lurking in the background, and it is that malfeasance that we should deal with first" (182-83). True enough, but it is this "first" that is appalling. If Blake does believe that there is little we can permissibly do to promote justice, except the most minor of tweaks around the margins, then there is no "first" to be had -- just a death sentence for those with no access to minimal public health provision. Perhaps it is fairer to understand Blake as denying, not the possibility of real improvement, but the possibility of making such an improvement specifically by means of emigration restrictions. If so then Brock's response -- we are talking here about what impoverished governments may do to help themselves given that rich countries are ignoring their obligations -- seems even more pointed.

Further, Blake understands the right to leave and renounce one's citizenship as a basic right, more basic even than Rawls's first principle. Rawls himself suggests that meeting basic needs is "lexically prior" to, and "must be assumed in applying" the equal basic liberties principle.[2] If, then, we are in the territory of moral claims more fundamental than Rawls's first principle, it would be helpful to have a better sense of how we balance these more-fundamental claims amongst themselves and against Rawlsian basic liberties. Is a "responsible but poor" government that fails to meet basic needs because it is processing passport applications worse or better than one that takes a year to process such applications but does a better job on basic needs? This moves us into the debate over the "progressive realization" doctrine, but Blake provides little guidance here. Without more work on foundations, the relative fundamentality and absoluteness of the right to exit in a "tragic" world is hard to assess.

Brock, on the other hand, assumes that "responsible but poor" governments will choose to spend scarce resources educating professionals such as doctors and nurses. But this is questionable; even without emigration, investments in health care tend to be inefficient uses of public-health or development funds. Educating physicians in particular tends to exacerbate inequalities and require the purchase of huge quantities of materials and medicines from rich countries. The health care sector is an insatiable resource-monster.[3] Moreover, this emphasis on health care leaves aside the lion's share of the "care drain" -- the movement of principally women away from their families and communities to provide low-cost labor that benefits people in wealthy countries.[4] These worries challenge the moral grounds for pouring resources into educating globally marketable professionals in the first place. (But in fairness, see 272-73).

Worries aside, this volume is overall a lively and challenging work that has much to teach most any reader. It will be particularly valuable in courses on political philosophy, where it will spur difficult debate while enabling the instructor to pick up the threads and use them to explain many of the most important issues in the field. For that reason this volume is particularly highly recommended.

[1] Alan Gilbert, Must Global Politics Constrain Democracy? (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1999),140.

[2] John Rawls, Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1993), 7.

[3] For insightful discussion see Larry Temkin, "Universal Health Coverage: Solution or Siren? Some Preliminary Thoughts," Journal of Applied Philosophy 31 (2014), 1-22.

[4] Arlie Russell Hochschild, "Love and Gold," Scholar & Feminist Online 8 (2009), accessed 5/13/15.