Debating Christian Theism

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J. P. Moreland, Chad Meister, and Khaldoun A. Sweis (eds.), Debating Christian Theism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 554pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199755431.

Reviewed by Alan R. Rhoda, Christian Theological Seminary


This is a wide-ranging and ambitious book. It contains pairs of contrasting pro/con essays by internationally recognized scholars on twenty topics "of central importance to the truth and rationality of historic Christianity" (2). The book is divided into two parts. Part One covers topics relevant to generic monotheism. It includes ten essays on various arguments for God's existence, four on the coherence of theism, and two each on the problem of evil, the bearing of evolutionary psychology on the rationality of religious belief, and mind -- body dualism. Part Two covers topics specific to Christian theism. In Part Two we find four essays on the rationality of Christian belief in relation to miracles and modern science, six on central Christian doctrines (Trinity, incarnation, and atonement), six on the historicity of the Gospels, the life of Jesus, and the resurrection, and two each on inclusivism/exclusivism and heaven and hell.

All of the essays, save one by the late John Hick, were newly commissioned for this book and are fairly representative of the cutting edge in contemporary philosophy of religion. The twenty topics were carefully selected by the editors, who then commissioned essays "for and against a Christian view of the issue" (2) by notable and relevant scholars. Contributors were invited to write on whatever aspects of the topic they thought most important and, with the apparent exception of Jeffrey P. Schloss and Michael J. Murray's reply to Joseph Bulbulia (see note 32 on p. 257), did not have access to their interlocutor's contribution at any point in the process. Nevertheless, most contributors apparently knew who their interlocutors were going to be and made an effort to interact with that person's previously published work on the topic. The result is a number of very good back-and-forth exchanges throughout the volume.

In what follows I briefly comment on the contributions for each of the twenty topics, paying specific attention to what seem to me to be their major strengths and weaknesses of the various essays.

The first five topics (chapters 1 -- 10) concern the existence of God. Chapters 1 and 2, by William Lane Craig and Wes Morriston, respectively, focus on the kalam cosmological argument. Craig's essay is a clear exposition and defense of the kalam argument. A few minor qualms aside (e.g., the somewhat dubious claim on p. 8 that "there can be no instantaneous events"), the argumentation is lucid and forceful and displays Craig's continued efforts to stay up to date with the latest developments in physical cosmology. Morriston's essay provides a nice counterpoint to Craig's. In particular, Morriston does a good job of rebutting Craig's Hilbert's Hotel analogy for the metaphysical impossibility of a concrete, actually infinite totality. I found Morriston's efforts to undermine the principle that "everything that begins to exist has a cause" on empiricist grounds much less convincing, however. His preferred restriction that "within the natural order" nothing can come to exist uncaused (29) strikes me as ad hoc. Why should causality suddenly drop out of the picture when moving from the natural to the supernatural?

Chapters 3 and 4 focus on cosmic fine-tuning versions of the design argument, with the "pro" essay by Robin Collins and the "con" by physicist Victor J. Stenger. What Collins's essay lacks in breadth, it more than makes up for in depth and argumentative cogency. Instead of marshalling as many lines of cosmic fine-tuning evidence as possible, Collins focuses on defending three carefully chosen examples of independent cosmic fine-tuning evidence and provides detailed and specific rebuttals to Stenger's published criticisms of them. Stenger's essay suffers by comparison with Collins's because even though it is broader in its coverage of the topic, it offers mostly brief and often overly dismissive rebuttals of a scattershot array of twenty-year-old popular-level fine-tuning arguments, mostly from the writings of Christian astrophysicist and apologist Hugh Ross. It should be noted that both essays are densely laden in places with physical symbols and units the meaning of which may be opaque to some readers.

Chapter 5 and 6 concern the ontological argument. E. J. Lowe defends his own nonstandard modal ontological argument. It's nonstandard because it doesn't start with the concept of God and because it doesn't rely on any modal inference from possible necessity to actuality. Instead, what Lowe offers is a cogently formulated and refreshingly original a priori argument from the existence of necessary, abstract objects like numbers to a necessary concrete being of a broadly theistic sort ("a rational being with a mind . . . so powerful that it can comprehend all of mathematics and logic" (70)) as their ontological ground. Lowe's interlocutor, Graham Oppy, criticizes a very different, and much simpler, ontological argument that Lowe presented in 2007 and in which he argues for the necessary existence of an absolutely independent being. After spending some time reflecting on the necessary conditions for a "successful" ontological argument, Oppy defends the speculative response that Lowe's absolutely independent being could be wholly natural.

Chapter 7 and 8 concern moral arguments for God's existence and pit Paul Copan against Louise Antony. There's a pretty good clash of opinions here. Copan argues that theism provides a "more natural setting" for objective moral truths than does naturalism, whereas Antony is primarily concerned to rebut arguments intended to show that naturalism and moral realism don't mix. Stylistically, Copan's essay is much less polished than Antony's. His arguments are often presented in loosely-connected bullet-point fashion, and he relies too much on quotations from other authors to make his points. While my sympathies are largely with Copan's views, I think Antony's essay comes across overall as more cogent. I think Copan's essay also suffers a bit from overreach. Instead of arguing that atheism is incompatible with moral realism, I think he would have been better served to press the more modest conclusion that theism can ground a richer and more robust morality than atheism. He very briefly hints on this as his "final point" at the very end of his essay (95 -- 96), but I would have liked to have seen it developed and made more central.

Chapters 9 and 10, the final pair on arguments for God, concern what J. P. Moreland calls the "argument from consciousness." As developed by Moreland, the basic idea is that the existence of nonphysical mental states (as attested by our own sense of consciousness) is better explained by a personal and theistic cause than by a natural scientific one. Moreland is at his strongest when explaining the difficulties that naturalists face when attempting to account for consciousness. Especially nice are his rebuttals of Searle's biological naturalism, McGinn's agnostic naturalism, and panpsychism. Moreland is less convincing, however, in explaining how these difficulties point specifically to theism. In response to Moreland, Oppy focuses a lot on theoretical virtues and other methodological matters. His understanding of "naturalism" is much thinner than Moreland's, and he winds up proposing what strikes me as a rather puzzling view according to which qualia do not exist and yet humans still have rich and conscious mental lives (140). Oppy argues, unconvincingly to my mind, that the theoretical virtues strongly favor his version of naturalism over Moreland's theism.

The next two topics (Chapters 11 through 14) concern challenges to the coherence of theism having to do with omnipotence and omniscience, respectively. The dialectical exchange on each topic is very similar, so I'll deal with these chapters as a group. The charges for incoherence are led by Nicholas Everitt (omnipotence) and Patrick Grim (omniscience). Both authors produce sophisticated arguments to exploit conceptual flaws in standard formulations of the divine attributes. Grim's essay, in particular, reads like a veritable tour de force. He marshals a battery of arguments, appealing to the divine liar paradox, the paradox of the knower, Cantor's power set theorem, and essential indexicals to argue that it is impossible for there to be a known collection of literally all truths. Likewise, Everitt argues that no definition of 'omnipotence' can simultaneously satisfy each of three constraints that he sets forth (self-consistency, compatibility with God's other essential attributes, and congruency with pre-theoretical intuitions about power and scope). For all their technical sophistication, though, both Grim's and Everitt's essays come across as religiously tone deaf. Both Charles Taliaferro (omnipotence) and Jerome Gellman (omniscience) in their responses emphasize that in thinking about divine attributes we need to be guided by perfect being theology and by a clear sense of the theological and religious purposes the attributes are supposed to serve. Why does it matter religiously that God be omnipotent and omniscient? Once we begin to answer that question, Taliaferro and Gellman insist, we will begin to see that puzzles like the paradox of the stone, the divine liar, essential indexicals, and the like fail to strike at the heart of theism. What most matters, they say, is not how much power or knowledge God has (quantity) but that God's power and knowledge be maximally praiseworthy (quality).

Chapters 15 and 16 are on the problem of evil. Both essays are very well written and together make for a nice introductory primer on the problem. Dripping with dry wit, Richard M. Gale's essay arguing that evil is good evidence against God easily wins the prize for funniest in the volume. Gale argues forcefully against the adequacy of several theodicies, both 'internal' ones that presuppose specifically Christian doctrines and 'external' ones that do not. He also raises a number of trenchant objections against skeptical theism. Gale's counterpart, Chad Meister, focuses on Michael Tooley's recent formulation of the problem of evil, gives a clear presentation of various theodicies, and closes by turning the tables by arguing that the objectivity of evil is a serious problem for naturalism.

Chapters 17 and 18 on the bearing of evolutionary psychology on the rationality of religious belief also offer a very nice exchange. Both essays are cogently argued and well developed. Bulbulia argues that evolutionary psychology "plausibly undermines the domain of religious beliefs" (223) because evolutionarily produced religious belief-forming mechanisms are unlikely to be "counterfactually sensitive" and thus the resulting beliefs lack warrant. In response, Schloss and Murray distinguish between remote and proximate causation of belief and argue that religious belief need not be undermined by evolutionary psychology because God may have been responsible for our belief-forming dispositions evolving the way they did.

The last topic in Part One (the nature of human beings) pits Stewart Goetz's defense of mind -- body dualism against Kevin Corcoran's defense of mind -- body physicalism. Interestingly, both Goetz and Corcoran take their respectively positions to be the commonsense position. Belief in substance dualism, says Goetz, is properly basic. Nevertheless, he does present what he calls the "simple argument" for dualism and rebuts common mind-brain correlation arguments for physicalism. Goetz's paper suffers, though, by its length. At nine pages it's one of the volume's shortest and would have greatly benefitted from a more extended engagement with arguments for and against dualism. In contrast with Goetz, Corcoran claims to be an "antecedent materialist." He rejects dualism not because of any argument but simply because he sees no use for a nonphysical soul. It's "explanatorily irrelevant and theologically unnecessary" (271). Corcoran effectively rebuts Goetz's simple argument (it establishes non-identity of body and soul, but that's not sufficient for dualism) and presents some standard neuroscience arguments for physicalism, but to me the most interesting part of Corcoran's paper is how he leverages theology in favor of physicalism. Not only does the integrity of God's creation argue in favor of physicalism (273), but also physicalism makes better sense of the two natures of Christ in the incarnation (277). Corcoran closes with a speculative account of how physicalists might be able to accommodate life after death without gappy existence.

Whereas Part One was concerned primarily with generic theism, Part Two is subtitled "debates about specific Christian beliefs." The first topic in Part Two is miracles and features essays by Evan Fales and Paul K. Moser. Fales argues on broadly Humean grounds that it is not reasonable to believe in miracles. He also proposes that Biblical accounts of miracles are best understood thematically or non-literally. As such, they can be reasonably believed, but they don't refer to divine interventions in nature. As for Moser's essay, one would have expected that it would include at the very least significant engagement with the Humean challenge to the rationality of belief in miracles, but alas it doesn't, not even a little. I found it the most disappointing in the volume -- not because it's bad in its own right (though I didn't find it exegetically persuasive) but because it completely forgets the nature of the volume it was written for. Instead of tackling the evidential and epistemological questions raised by miracles, Moser pursues an extended and entirely theological reflection on the redemptive significance of divine "signs," particularly the person of Jesus. There's certainly a time and place for such reflections, but not in the context of a volume in which we're supposed to be debating Christian theism.

Chapters 23 and 24 consider whether science is at odds with Christianity. Julian Baggini says "yes" and Keith Ward says "no." The question, says Baggini, is not whether Christianity is compatible with science -- mere compatibility is cheap -- but whether a theistic-friendly version of science is more reasonable than its denial (313). It is often said that science deals with how questions and religion deals with why questions, but Baggini rejects this dichotomy as inappropriate to Christianity because interventionist forms of theism are also implicated in the hows (How did that water turn into wine? God did it.). He concludes with a dilemma: "If religion truly sticks to only why, then it cannot be a theistic religion with an activist, free God. If it gets itself involved with hows, . . . then it is offering competing explanations to those of science." (321) As to why these explanations must be competing, though, I don't see that Baggini has much of a case other than invoking methodological naturalism and the "God of the gaps" bogeyman. For his part, Ward concedes that there are several "points of possible tension" (323) between Christianity and science. He identifies six such points, including creation, miracles, resurrection, and demon possession, and suggests ways of thinking about each of these issues that might help reduce the tension. Some of his proposals are quite speculative, though, and may be deemed unacceptable to Christians of various persuasions (e.g., "Creation is not literally the beginning of the physical universe, but the dependence of every time upon the transtemporal being of God" (328)).

The next topic (chapters 25 and 26) is the Trinity. Timothy Winter, an Islamic scholar, contends that the Trinity is "incoherent," not in the sense of being either metaphysically impossible or nonsensical but in the sense that it does not cohere with two criteria internal to Christianity: (1) it "appears to be incompatible with the faith of Jesus and the apostolic generations" (353), and (2) its "simultaneous centrality and obscurity" (354). Thomas D. Senor, in contrast, engages directly with standard metaphysical arguments against the Trinity and sketches a model drawing on both the Greek and Latin traditions that, he believes, is both coherent and fully orthodox. He lays out the main issues with admirable clarity, though I don't think his model is fully successful because he doesn't show how the ontological primacy of the Father is compatible (if it is compatible) with the equality of the persons.

Chapters 27 and 28 are on the atonement. They represent a substantive and stimulating exchange between two of philosophy of religion's most recognized scholars, Richard Swinburne and the late John Hick. Swinburne presents a clear summary of his well-known "sacrifice theory" of the atonement, which he contrasts with ransom, penal substitution, and satisfaction theories. Roughly stated, Swinburne's view is that atonement has four components: repentance, apology, reparation, and penance. It's not enough for us to repent and apologize for our sins, says Swinburne. We owe God a perfect life as reparation and since we do not have that to give, God gave the life of His Son for us to appropriate as our reparation and penance. Hick's contribution is a republished 1996 paper in which he conducts a broad historical survey of atonement theories and criticizes Western "transactional" theories of the atonement, including Swinburne's. The basic fault of all such theories, says Hick, is that "they have no room for divine forgiveness" (384). In place of transactional theories, Hick proposes a broadly Eastern or "transformational" theory according to which Jesus's life, death, and resurrection paint a compelling moral picture that helps lift us out of our self-centeredness to an ego-transcending reality centeredness. Collectively, these two essays make a great overview of the central issues in the atonement debate. My only (minor) reservation is Hick's somewhat annoying tendency to dismiss ideas simply for being out of sync with our modern, democratic, and scientifically enlightened moral outlook.

The topic of chapters 29 and 30 is the incarnation. Atheist philosopher Michael Martin challenges the incarnation on both conceptual and evidential grounds. He engages exclusively with Thomas Morris's well-known work on the subject, criticizing among other things Morris's epistemic explanation of how Jesus could be tempted and yet not be able to sin. In response to Martin, Katherin A. Rogers makes clever use of a "virtual self" analogy as well as Anselm's notion of freedom as "the ability of an agent to be good from himself" (398) to defend the incarnation against Martin's criticisms. I really liked her essay and I think she plausibly improves upon certain aspects of Morris's work.

The next three topics focus on historical questions, specifically, the historical reliability of the Gospels, the historicity of Jesus, and the historicity of the resurrection, respectively. In chapters 31 and 32, Stephen T. Davis and Marcus Borg spar over the Gospels. Both essays are interesting and engaging. They both affirm the overall historical reliability or accuracy of the Gospels, but they disagree about how important its historical reliability is for the Christian message. Borg takes the primary import of many Gospels accounts, including the birth of Jesus and the Easter narratives, to be metaphorical or "parabolic" in a way that does not depend on their historical reliability (e.g., on whether the tomb was really empty or on whether Jesus was actually visited by three wise men). In contrast, Davis rejects Borg's notion that the parabolic "meaning" of the resurrection is more important that its historicity. "If Jesus was not actually raised by God," he writes, "then the 'resurrection of Jesus' ultimately means virtually nothing, apart perhaps from some lessons about facing death bravely." (426)

The essays on the historicity of Jesus and on the resurrection (chapters 33 through 36) follow a similar dialectical pattern. In the first pair, Stephen J. Patterson argues that "the Christ of faith" is not "the Jesus of history" (447), whereas Craig A. Evans argues that what "informed Christians" believe about Jesus is a "fair and reasonable construction" from the ancient sources (458). Of the two, I think Evans handily wins the exchange. Patterson wears his naturalistic bias on his sleeve and too quickly dismisses supernatural depictions of Jesus as contrary to "common sense" and thus as not "historically credible" (448). In contrast, Evans comes across as much more willing to let the evidence speak for itself. He distinguishes between historical and theological claims concerning Jesus and is careful to limit his conclusions to what he thinks the strictly historical evidence will bear, leaving the theological implications of those conclusions as a work for others.

Similarly, on the resurrection, James G. Crossley opens by admitting a strong naturalistic bias and proceeds to deny the historicity of the empty tomb. Despite conceding an early date for Mark and early Christian belief in the bodily resurrection, he doubts (without offering any specific historical evidence for this supposition) that anyone even knew where Jesus was buried, and he chalks early belief in the bodily resurrection up to visions of departed loved ones. In contrast, Gary R. Habermas takes a measured and carefully argued "minimal historical facts" approach to the subject and responds specifically and in great detail to Crossley's published work. In my opinion Habermas easily wins the exchange.

The penultimate topic concerns whether Jesus is "the only way" to God. Harold Netland takes an affirmative position, whereas Paul F. Knitter defends a negative position. There's not, however, as much clash as it may seem at first glance. Netland is concerned with establishing that Jesus's life, death, and resurrection is the ontic ground of salvation, whereas Knitter is focused primarily on the epistemic requirements for salvation. For Netland, Jesus is "the only way" in the sense that what Jesus accomplished through his death and resurrection is necessary for anyone to be saved. But he expresses no commitment to the further claim that it is only through explicit knowledge or belief in Jesus that one can be saved. It is this further requirement of knowledge or belief that Knitter is most concerned to deny. To some extent, then, the two essays wind up talking past each other.

Last but not least is a lively exchange between Jerry L. Walls and Keith Parsons on the Christian doctrines of heaven and hell. Walls devotes equal attention to heaven and hell, whereas Parsons focuses almost exclusively on hell. Both of them agree in rejecting a particularist and retributive conception of hell. Instead, Walls favors an inclusivist, non-retributive model on which hell is a natural consequence of rejecting God's salvific invitation and on which there is room for post-mortem repentance. For his part, Parsons trains his fire on the "traditional" Christian conception of hell, which he takes to be strongly particularist (i.e., you have to believe very specific things about Jesus to be saved), retributive (i.e., God imposes severe punishment on the damned), and permanent (i.e., no second chances). Parsons agrees that Walls's vision of heaven and hell is an "attractive" one, but he raises some questions for it as well, such as "If God could give us a full and fair understanding of the Gospel in the afterlife, why cannot he do it in this life?" (542)

Summing up, I think that on the whole, for range of topics, quality of argumentation, and up-to-date currency with recent scholarship, this volume is very hard to beat. I know of no comparable volume that shares that constellation of virtues. While there are a few places where, in my judgement, the contributions don't live up to expectations, they are by far the exceptions. The vast majority of the essays are really excellent despite their generally short length (twelve pages on average). I believe this volume would make a very good resource for undergraduate and graduate seminars in philosophy of religion, theology, and apologetics.