Debating Climate Ethics

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Stephen M. Gardiner and David A. Weisbach, Debating Climate Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 272pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199996483.

Reviewed by Byron Williston, Wilfrid Laurier University


The stated goal of the United Nations Framework Convention on Climate Change (UNFCCC) is to ensure that greenhouse gas concentrations in the atmosphere are stabilized so that "dangerous anthropogenic interference" in the climate system is avoided. In December 2015, the body charged with crafting an international agreement to make this happen, the Conference of Parties, met in Paris and agreed that the only way to prevent such interference is to keep average global temperatures "well below" 2°C relative to the pre-industrial baseline. Most have interpreted this as meaning that we should work towards a 1°5C guardrail. Because the world has already warmed by about 1°C, with probably close to another 1°C 'in the pipeline,' this is an extraordinarily ambitious goal. It means not just decarbonizing the global economy rapidly but also finding a way to remove some of the carbon already in the atmosphere (through massive afforestation projects, for instance). Meeting the target -- or even just avoiding the path of catastrophe we are already on, which is taking us to a 5°C world -- will require bold policy innovation. The question is, what theoretical tools best equip us to understand the challenge?

Over the past three decades or so, one of the most persistent contests here has been between philosophers and economists. Philosophers working in this area tend to assume that climate change is above all a crisis of values (that of justice above all), and that philosophical ethics can help us clarify both what is at stake and what must be done. Though there are exceptions, as a group they favor far-reaching alterations in our political and economic priorities in order to meet the challenge. Economists, again with some exceptions, tend to be more conservative, to argue either that the problem is overblown or that, if it is not, the traditional tools of cost-benefit analysis (CBA) are sufficient to address it. The result of this impasse is protracted disagreement between advocates of these two approaches about the basic goals of climate policy.

One of the most refreshing aspects of Gardiner and Weisbach's contribution to this debate is that both of them -- Gardiner a philosopher, Weisbach an economist -- think that rapid decarbonization must be the paramount aim of climate policy (the book was written before Paris, so the discussion is centered on the 2°C goal rather than the more ambitious one). In a book constructed as an extended debate between philosophy and economics this already represents a significant step forward in our understanding of the problem. But profound disagreements remain. The main point of contention concerns the usefulness of philosophical ethics for helping us grapple with the problem of climate change: Gardiner thinks that the problem is fundamentally ethical, while Weisbach thinks that ethics provides, at best, a supplement to the more foundational approach of CBA. The book has three parts. The first contains Gardiner's arguments in favor of ethics, the second Weisbach's arguments against ethics, and the third a very brief -- too brief, I think -- response by each author to some of the points made by the other. I'll summarize the main arguments of Parts I and II, then provide two critical comments.

Part I begins with Gardiner's now familiar claim that climate change represents a "perfect moral storm," comprised of four sub-storms. The first is the "global storm," which involves spatial and geopolitical aspects of the problem focused on the present. The second is the "intergenerational storm," which has to do with the temporal aspects of the problem. The third is the "ecological storm," the tendency for the interests of the non-human parts of the biosphere to get lost in our efforts to address the issue at the level of human systems. Finally, there is the "theoretical storm," which describes the inadequacy of our attempts to understand the phenomenon of climate change from the standpoint of systematic theory (the criticism is not confined to philosophical theories, a point to which I will return).

Gardiner uses the trope of the perfect storm to advance an enormously complex, and compelling, theory of the cultural phenomenon of climate change. Two general points about it deserve more sustained attention than I am able to provide here. First, the trope indicates clearly that our policy inertia in this area is overdetermined. One of these storms would be bad enough but the convergence of all three makes it nearly impossible to address with the requisite seriousness or depth. Second, precisely because of this feature of the situation, we are apt to display one or another form of "moral corruption" in the search for solutions.

As an illustration of how the analysis works, consider the intergenerational storm (arguably the most important of the four). Like the global storm it is characterized by a "dispersion of causes and effects, fragmentation of agency, and institutional inadequacy." (24) For Gardiner this is best expressed as a collective action problem on the model of the prisoner's dilemma. Think of the 'players' here as members of temporally spread generations. First, since nobody wants a severely polluted world, it is "collectively rational for most generations to cooperate" in the task of pollution abatement (here, emissions reduction). But, second, it is "individually rational for all generations not to cooperate," since each generation will by this means accrue all the economic benefits of polluting while the costs are spread across generations.

Gardiner calls this the "Pure Intergenerational Problem," and argues that it is "worse" than the traditional prisoner's dilemma. This is because (a) every generation prefers pollution abatement, except the first one in any temporal sequence; and (b) the incentives to avoid cooperation are deeper in view of the fact that some of the players do not yet exist and therefore have no power to wield over existing players (26-29). This second problem is significant because such power -- roughly symmetrical among all players -- is instrumental in creating incentives to build the institutional scaffolding that helps ensure cooperation going forward. The upshot of the problem is a "tyranny of the contemporary" (27) that both abets and is abetted by moral corruption: "distraction, complacency, unreasonable doubt, selective attention, delusion, pandering, false witness, and hypocrisy." (40) Crucially, since the diagnosis of the problem is ethical to its core -- Gardiner clearly thinks we are not properly valuing those who will be most affected by climate change: the global poor, non-human nature, future people -- so too is whatever solution we come up with.

In the second half of Part I, Gardiner argues that economics cannot provide an adequate understanding of this challenge. The discussion is wide-ranging, but focuses on four "strands of hostility" displayed by the economist towards climate ethics. The claim is that the strands express misguided beliefs about both the limitations of ethics and the reach of economics as theoretical resources. The first strand is the economist's claim that ethics should be isolated from "pure policy," and that the latter is matter for the technocrats. (47) The main criticism of this view is that is perpetuates the tyranny of the contemporary by assuming that present institutions "promote the interests of future generations." (51) The second strand bypasses ethics and goes straight to the science and the belief that it is a sufficient source of information about what we should do. But of course science is not value free. For example, the UNFCCC's statement about "dangerous" interference in the climate system is ambiguous in a way that seems to call for ethical analysis. What is dangerous for the North or people of the present is different from what is dangerous for the South or people of the future. Since competing claims of justice look ineliminable here, how we negotiate ambiguities like this is something about which the science alone cannot provide much guidance (52).

The third strand of hostility has to do with the issue of "feasibility." Economists will assert that philosophers violate feasibility constraints because the solutions philosophers offer are utopian whereas economists must always have an eye on what we are realistically capable of (54). Gardiner responds by arguing, among other things, that "the feasible is political," (247) meaning that judgments of feasibility often conceal moral failure or the supposed prerogatives of political elites. The fourth strand of hostility is more foundational. The claim here is that to meet the challenge of climate change we do not need to transcend appeals to (enlightened) self-interest, and since this is the bailiwick of economics ethics has no work to do here (55). Gardiner responds by criticizing at length the "International Mutual Benifitism" (IMB) -- an extension of Paretianism claiming that no state can be made worse off by any proposed climate treaty (56) -- that, he thinks, underlies this claim. There is much more of interest here but I hope this précis gives some indication of the scope and power of Gardiner's seminal way of framing the climate change challenge.

In Part II, Weisbach presents his arguments against ethics. Ethical arguments about climate change suffer from two "serious and systematic flaws." (139) First, philosophers are wearing "blinders." This shows up in a number of ways but the most important appears to be the idea that "climate change policy should be designed with distributive goals in mind." (140) A better approach is to separate these goals -- themselves entirely legitimate for Weisbach -- from climate policy so that the latter can focus exclusively on finding the cheapest possible way to reduce global emissions. Philosophy plays little role in this exercise. The second flaw brings us back to feasibility constraints, which are, it is claimed, routinely violated by philosophers. For example, Peter Singer has advocated creating equal per-capita emissions rights based on UN population projections extending to 2050. Weisbach argues that the amounts of cash that would have to be transferred from rich to poor countries under this scheme would be so vast that such a "policy recommendation is utopian in the bad sense of the word." Although ethics must, Weisbach recognizes, be "demanding," proposals like this are "at best idle chatter, and at worst, divert our attention from actual solutions." (142)

Much of the second half of Part II (chapter 7) is devoted to showing how it is that prominent theories of climate justice -- distributive justice, corrective justice, and equal per-capita emissions theories -- run afoul of the requirements to avoid blinders and to be politically feasible. There are some sound points made here, and philosophers would do well to pay careful attention to Weisbach's arguments in this section of the book. But to my mind the more interesting claims come in the middle chapter of this Part (chapter 6), which contains Weisbach's positive arguments for grounding aggressive climate policy in self-interest, as well as a CBA constrained by broadly Paretian considerations. Weisbach sets out to show that "under almost any plausible assumptions about climate change, it is in our self-interest to start reducing emissions now, on a global basis, and to reduce emissions to near zero in the not-too-distant future." (170) This is a bold pronouncement both because most philosophers view bare appeals to self-interest as an impediment to the demands of genuine intergenerational concern and because most economists are much more conservative than Weisbach in their policy prescriptions in this area.

Weisbach has a firm command of the climate science and an even more impressive mastery of the policy options available to us. There may be no more succinct analysis of the numbers that are relevant to intelligent decision making than what he gives us in this chapter of the book. There is also an intriguing argument here for the claim that the developing world must essentially leapfrog fossil fuels in the process of development (186-187), an idea that has immense implications for the geopolitics of climate change. However, the most important claim of the chapter is that climate change is "a surprisingly near-term problem," (179) one that will affect the lives of us, our children and our grandchildren. It is this three-generation focus that grounds the appeal to self-interest. We do not need to invoke justice on behalf of the interests of temporally distant people or non-human parts of the biosphere. Self-interest does all the work we need. This brings us to the first of two brief critical points.

Weisbach's Paretianism specifies that nobody be made worse off in a climate treaty. This, of course, includes the United States. But this seems unjust on its face since, with respect to historical responsibility for emissions, the U.S. is an outlier. It is deeply problematic to assume that the extraordinary wealth the U.S. has obtained on the back of fossil fuel emissions should be viewed as a baseline for its own future targets. More fundamentally, the wealth it has accrued almost guarantees that the U.S. will simply abandon mitigation if given the option. This is because in the short to medium term the U.S. is, as Robert Paarlberg has shown, among the world's least vulnerable countries with respect to severe climate disruption. Indeed, William Nordhaus, an economist, has argued that even if the 2°C guardrail is breached, by 2070 about 90% of the economy of the U.S. will be "only lightly or negligibly impacted."[1] A predictable result of noticing this, already in ample evidence, is a focus on adaptation rather than mitigation, which probably leads down the path of long-term climate disaster. But because the three-generation gaze looks comparatively rosy, Weisbach has given us no basis for caring about -- and thus taking steps to avoid -- this likely longer-term outcome.

The second critical point is about theoretical inadequacy and Gardiner's fourth moral storm, about which I want to make two points. First, in declaring his agreement with Gardiner about the "inadequacy of existing theories of ethics," (259) Weisbach seems to have overlooked the fact that Gardiner also includes CBA in his negative assessment. For someone who places such emphasis on alertness to blinders, this is a curious oversight. Second, the claim about theoretical inadequacy can be overstated or misinterpreted. The "central question," for Gardiner, concerns "the kinds of institutions that are needed to confront the problem" of climate change (159), and it is true that we do not have a systematic theoretical understanding of the issue at this level. But from the standpoint of ethics proper -- rather than, say, political theory -- I don't think the challenge of climate change is insuperably difficult to capture in one or another of our standard theories. For example, I think that the right sort of virtue ethics is up to the task, both diagnostically and prescriptively.[2] To the extent that Gardiner's claims here invite a blanket dismissal of climate ethics -- which is certainly how Weisbach interprets them -- they should be resisted.

These points aside, this is an extremely valuable book and I recommend it warmly. Both authors display an admirable tenacity, courage, forbearance, and intelligence. Their debate marks a significant advance in our attempts to grapple with this most serious of issues.

[1] Paarlberg, Robert. 2015. The United States of Excess: Gluttony and the Dark Side of American Exceptionalism. Oxford University Press, 152-154.

[2] See Williston, Byron. 2015. The Anthropocene Project: Virtue in the Age of Climate Change. Oxford University Press.