Debating Design: From Darwin to DNA

Placeholder book cover

William Dembski and Michael Ruse (eds.), Debating Design: From Darwin to DNA, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 422pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521829496.

Reviewed by Dan D. Crawford, University of Nebraska, Lincoln


William Dembski, prominent leader of the Intelligent Design movement, and Michael Ruse, prominent defender of evolutionary theory, have teamed up to give us a rich collection of essays centering on the Design debate. While admitting that they are "at opposite ends of the spectrum", the editors agree that ID is a significant enough movement on the current scene, "if only culturally," that it "should not be ignored." (p.4) But cultural and social agendas, and defenses against them, are thankfully absent from this volume; the focus is on intellectual debate in which each side is supposed to present its best arguments so that each can know what the other is saying, and so that the reader "can quickly grasp the fundamental claims and counterclaims being made." (p.4)

The collection is also helpful in giving a background to the Design debate -- in Ruse's "Brief History" of the design argument and Angus Menuge's "Survey" of the ID movement; and also in Elliott Sober's useful analytical and historical discussion of the design argument -- especially the key claim that the design hypothesis is "more likely" than naturalistic alternatives.

But the main attractiveness of this book for this reader was the variety of viewpoints and issues that radiate out from the two central foci of evolution and design. The discussion ranges far beyond the claims and counterclaims of the two opposing theories. Indeed, there are four very different viewpoints represented about equally in the four sections of the book: I. Darwinism; II. Complex Self-Organization; III. Theistic Evolution; and IV. Intelligent Design, each with four or five contributors. (But one wonders, why is the theory that supposedly generates the whole debate put last? It should be first.)

And it turns out that there are three different strands of debate occurring in these pages: 1) the ongoing debate between Darwinists and their ID critics; 2) a more recent debate within the naturalist camp between defenders of the neo-Darwinian synthesis and those who think Darwinian principles and mechanisms are not sufficient to explain living systems; and 3) a debate in the supernaturalist camp between ID theory and those (Christian) theologians who embrace evolutionary science and have a very different idea of how the Creator is related to the universe.

The central claims of ID theory are that "in order to explain life … there must be something more than ordinary natural causes or material mechanisms, and moreover, that something must be intelligent and [an agent] capable of bringing about organisms." (p.3) I would add to these the further claim that the Intelligent Design hypothesis is a scientific explanation in the sense that the scientific community should investigate it as a competitor of the Darwinian account.

The Darwinian view is cogently defended by Francisco Ayala in his essay "Design without Designer: Darwin's Greatest Discovery." (The other representatives of "Darwinism" besides Sober, are Ken Miller and Robert Pennock.) Contrary to what ID theorists have claimed, Evolutionary Theory can give a fully adequate explanation of the appearance of design and of the organizational complexity of living systems in terms of random variation and natural selection. However, in what is clearly a response to critics, Ayala writes: "Evolution is not the outcome of purely random processes; rather, there is a "selecting" process, which picks up adaptive combinations because these reproduce more effectively and thus become established in populations. These adaptive combinations constitute, in turn, new levels of organization upon which the mutation (random) plus selection (nonrandom or directional) process again operates." (p.61)

There is a place in biology for teleological explanations. Ayala distinguishes systems with teleological features that are caused by a natural process, such as the wings of birds (internal), from those that are the result of a purposeful agent, such as a knife (external). "The wings of birds have a natural teleology; they serve an end Ð flying --but their configuration is not due to the conscious design of any agent." "Bounded natural teleology exists when a specific end state is reached in spite of environmental fluctuations," e.g. the development of an egg. "Unbounded design, or contingent teleology occurs when the end state is not specifically predetermined but rather is the result of selection of one from among several available alternatives," e.g. the wings of birds. For "there was nothing in the constitution of the remote ancestors of birds that would necessitate the appearance of wings in their descendants … . At each stage [in their development] the most advantageous alternative was selected among those that happened to be available; but which alternatives were available at any one time depended, at least in part, on chance events." (pp.66-67, my emphasis)

Ayala's stark formulation of natural selection as a creative process, "subject to the vagaries of genetic mutation and environmental challenge" and without "a preordained plan, whether imprinted from without by an omniscient and all-powerful Designer or resulting from some immanent force driving the process towards definite outcomes" (pp.63-64), brings into sharp relief the radically contingent nature of Darwin's proposal -- that the teeming variety and novelty in the biological realm depend totally on what happens to occur in the DNA and in the environment. In spite of Ayala's well-chosen, plausible examples illustrating his claims, it is easy to see why ID theorists see this account as containing large explanatory leaps that need a lot of filling in. Also, one wonders whether Ayala can help himself to so much teleological description without its forcing some shift toward teleology in the underlying mechanisms.

Defenders of Intelligent Design theory (Dembski, Michael Behe, Walter Bradley, Stephen Meyer) present arguments that purport to show that the accepted evolutionary theory fails to explain various aspects of living organisms, viz., complex specified information (CSI), functional systems like the bacterial flagellum, and the Cambrian explosion. Dembski and Bradley lay out similar arguments based on the precisely calculated improbability of complex specified information such as we find in living systems like the flagellum (Dembski) or in biopolymers DNA, RNA, and protein (Bradley). Dembski writes that the probabilities of these complexly organized systems evolving by material mechanisms "are horrendous and render natural selection utterly implausible as a mechanism for generating the flagellum and structures like it." (p.326) Since the choice is between all material mechanisms and design, and "since design is uniformly associated with specified complexity when the underlying causal story is known, induction counsels attributing design in cases where the underlying causal story is not known." (p. 321)

Although Dembski's and Behe's arguments for the non-reducibility of the flagellum are essentially negative -- aimed at showing what evolutionary theory has not explained and cannot explain -- Dembski insists that the argument is based on (positive) empirical evidence. "Our best evidence points to the specified complexity (and therefore design) of the bacterial flagellum." (p.326) But can Darwinian mechanisms explain how these complex systems came to be?

The Dembski and Behe essays should be read in conjunction with Weber and Depew's contribution, "Darwinism, Design, and Complex Systems Dynamics," which takes up the challenge of explaining how some systems with CSI, such as the immune system and blood-clotting, could plausibly have emerged from simpler systems via Darwinian processes. Scientific work aimed at testing scenarios that have recently been proposed for blood clotting "is proceeding and is beginning to provide the basis for shifting to the question of 'why actually ' [and not merely 'how possibly'] such a complex cascade has actually arisen in evolution by natural selection." (p.177) Ken Miller points to recent work in explaining how the Krebs cycle actually evolved. (p.92) He claims further that molecular biologists have identified "homologous component proteins" in the flagellum and the type III protein secretory system (TTSS). "It is now clear … that a smaller subset of the full complement of proteins in the flagellum makes up the functional transmembrane portion of the TTSS." (p.86)

Dembski is unimpressed by these sorts of proposed Darwinian histories, arguing that they only meet the challenge if the probability of each step in the proposed series is 1) quantifiable; 2) reasonably large; and 3) constitutes an advantage to the evolving system. The first two of these requirements seem overly strict and to reflect Dembski's preferred methodology; and the third is met if simpler systems or components can be shown to have some function. But what is significant about this exchange is that ID theorists have raised questions that have sparked new thinking and research from evolutionary theorists. This research program appears to be only in its beginning phase (pace Miller), and whether it will succeed in giving "how-actually" explanations without causing revisions in the general theory remains to be seen.

But the main obstacle to the Design hypothesis achieving scientific consideration is that no attempt is made in any of these papers to specify how the intelligent agent causes complex specified information; that is, the hypothesized activity of the designer is not defined operationally. The hypothesis then, whether supernatual or natural, remains so general and unspecified that scientists literally couldn't do anything with it even if they wanted to. This criticism is illustrated in this volume by Pennock's challenge to Meyer (who argues that evolutionary principles cannot account for the Cambrian explosion) to state specifically what the intelligent designer is supposed to have done to bring about the Cambrian proliferation. (p.133) And indeed, Meyer is conspicuously silent on this question.

A third voice appears in this collection under the rubric "Complex Self-Organization" (represented by Stuart Kauffman, James Barham, Bruce Weber and David Depew, Paul Davies). This viewpoint agrees with the negative thesis of Intelligent Design theory that evolutionary principles are inadequate to explain life, but does not seek that explanation in any (external) intelligent cause. What is needed instead is a redefinition of living matter and its mode of functioning.

Stuart Kauffman, in his essay "Prolegomenon to a General Biology," a version of the first chapter of his 2000 study, Investigations, asserts that there are many unanswered questions or puzzles in biology that call for a more adequate theory. "Much of the order in organisms, I believe, is self-organized and spontaneous. Self-organization mingles with natural selection in barely understood ways to yield the magnificence of our teeming biosphere. We must, therefore, expand evolutionary theory." (p.151) Kauffman begins to outline the new categories and laws that will be needed in a general biology -- categories that have a strong teleological flavor. Organisms should be viewed as "autonomous agents" capable of acting on their own behalf in an environment. (p.157) "Yet the bacterium, the yeast cell, and we are all just physical systems." What makes these physical systems autonomous agents? Kauffman's tentative answer invokes new descriptive language: "A molecular autonomous agent is a self-reproducing molecular system able to carry out one or more thermodynamic work-cycles." (p.158)

Another puzzle: "most organisms are sexual. If organisms are sexual because recombination is a good search strategy, but recombination is only useful as a search strategy on certain classes of fitness landscapes, where did those fitness landscapes come from? No one knows … Somehow, evolution has brought forth the kind of smooth landscapes upon which recombination itself is a successful search strategy." (p.168-169) The solution to this puzzle Kauffman adumbrates is in terms of the organism's having a way of making a living in a "natural game". (Kauffman acknowledges the influence of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations.) He concludes that "organisms, niches, and search procedures jointly and self-consistently co-construct one another! We make the world in which we make a living such that we can, and have, more or less mastered that evolving world as we make it." (p.170)

Kauffman's highly programmatic approach suggests that a larger understanding of life and evolutionary change will involve a new conception of the self-creative, self-organizing tendencies within matter, but he does not think that any of the puzzles he identifies points to some agency outside the natural process. (In evaluating Kauffman, the reader should also look at Behe's and Meyer's criticisms of Kauffman's account of the origin of life and its achievement of specified complexity. (pp.348-9,384-5))

James Barham is even more ambitious than Kauffman about the need for revision of evolutionary principles. He gives forceful criticisms of what he calls the "Mechanistic Consensus" which claims that natural selection, together with the known laws of physics and chemistry and special disciplines such as molecular biology can fully explain how living things work. (p.210) He then argues for the need to invest living functional systems with real (not as-if) properties of purposiveness and value. "Suppose that the teleological and normative character of living things really derived from an essential connection between biological function and the spontaneous activity of living matter. In that case, such a connection might give rise to systems that prefer or value some of their own possible states over other, energetically equivalent ones, and that strive to attain those preferred states under the constraint of external conditions in accordance with means-ends logic." (p.211) Organisms are not machines with parts that are essentially independent variables. Barham anticipates that the "machine metaphor", which has been so extraordinarily fruitful in science, is beginning to give way to a holistic conception of an organism as an "active and fully integrated system." (p.216) This ordering principle "is logically prior to selection, since novel biological forms must already exist before they can be selected. Indeed, all viable novel forms are always already entrained into a fully integrated functional system before selection occurs." (p.217)

But this suggested failure of the mechanistic metaphor does not give aid and comfort to the Intelligent Design theory, which also adopts the machine model (cf. Behe's mousetrap). For "[t]he emergence of objective biological value as an intrinsic property of living matter is a coherent alternative that warrants further investigation." (p.222)

While Design theorists are undoubtedly encouraged by the criticism of Darwinism coming from within the evolutionist camp, they, in turn, are at odds with the Christian theologians represented in this book. Contributors to the "Theistic Evolution" section include John Polkinghorne, Keith Ward, Michael Roberts, John Haught, and Richard Swinburne. (Swinburne's philosophical argument for God is the exception; his cosmological argument is squarely in the tradition of natural theology, as is the Design Inference.) I will take the essays by Polkinghorne and Ward as representative of this perspective. These authors do not call for any significant revision in the evolutionary account of life or doubt the sufficiency of natural selection as the mechanism of evolutionary change. Their question is then quite different from that of the ID theorists: it is to consider the implications of the scientific account of the physical and biological realms for theology. How does this picture square with the traditional Christian idea of a Creator-God?

Both ID theory and theistic evolution see the evolutionary account as prima facie in conflict with their religious belief in a creator-designer God; but whereas the ID theorists reject evolution and attempt to put something else in its place, theistic evolutionists try to adjust their theological belief about God to make it fit with what science is telling us. Thus Polkinghorne focuses on broad features of the scientific worldview: the element of chance, the openness and "intrinsic unpredictabilities in the processes of the universe", and the evil and suffering. (p.257) God could have brought into being a "ready-made world", but instead did something cleverer, bringing into being a creation that could "make itself". (p.256) "Just as we may understand the reliability of 'necessity' as being a pale reflection of the Creator's faithfulness, so we may understand the role of 'chance' as being an expression of God's loving gift of freedom." (p.256)

But theology should not do all the adjusting, for some constraints are put on science from the side of theology. As Ward puts it: if God created the universe, then God's act was intentional and done "in order to realise some purpose." "This entails that evolution cannot simply be random or the result of blind necessity. It must be choosable, and must have been chosen, by a rational agent for the sake of some good that it, and perhaps it alone, makes possible." (p.262) Polkinghorne stresses the "inbuilt potentiality" in matter for the emergence of "carbon-based life, with its potentiality to develop self-conscious beings." (p.255) And Ward echoes this: "the basic physical processes themselves might be seen as purposively oriented from the start toward the development of consciousness, purpose, and value." (p.265) These remarks suggest that evolutionary science must be modified, at least in its (metaphysical) assumptions that the universe is "grounded … in chance or blind necessity" (p.267), and that there is no orientation toward a goal in living matter.

It would seem that theistic evolutionists have more in common with the revisionist program that we saw in Kauffman and Barham than with the orthodox Darwinian view that they embrace. (Polkinghorne cites Kauffman approvingly.) Both views also reject the claim "that some form of direct divine 'intervention' is needed to bring about life." (Polkinghorne, p.251) However the theists would not concur with the self-organizationists' belief that the ordering principles in matter do not require any further explanation; instead, they "point beyond themselves in … a theistic direction." (p.251)

As a whole, this collection goes far beyond the Design debate and enlivens and enriches a number of topics in the debate between science and religion. Regarding design, this reader came away with the impression that the best arguments of the Intelligent Design theorists have not cut very forcefully or deeply either in the scientific community or in the theological community or among those of us who take both of these perspectives seriously. It may be that the Dembski-Bradley type of argument from improbability is having some effect, since Darwinists do seem increasingly to be looking for ways to constrain the evolutionary process toward life and its complex specified genetic information. But the Dembski-Behe line of argument for irreducibility, based as it is on the interchangeability of the discrete parts of molecular systems, probably will not persuade. However, the ID movement has raised questions that have forced evolutionary scientists across the board to reexamine their explanations of organic processes, of the origin of life, and of evolutionary change, and to recognize that some parts of these explanations are not fully satisfactory. And this book gives some reason to believe that by a series of numerous, successive, slight modifications, the Darwinian model may be undergoing a significant change.