Debating Medieval Natural Law: A Survey

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Riccardo Saccenti, Debating Medieval Natural Law: A Survey, University of Notre Dame Press, 2016, 155pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268100407.

Reviewed by Steven J. Jensen, University of St. Thomas, Houston


Some time between the twelfth century and the modern era a divide seems to have arisen between natural law and natural right. Natural law emphasizes rules to be followed, while natural right emphasizes some aspect of a person by which he has dominion over himself and by which he makes claims upon others. My right to liberty, for instance, implies that I can do with myself as I please, just so long as I do not harm others, that is, just so long as I do not impinge upon the "rights" of others. On the other hand, natural law tells me how I should act and sets limits to my behavior. The difference between law and right, it seems, could hardly be more distant.

In contrast, the Latin terms lex naturale and jus naturale were often used synonymously. Both could refer to an objective order of behavior. Over time, it seems, the meanings of jus and lex have drifted apart. While lex has retained its objective meaning, jus eventually took on the subjective meaning of modern rights talk. When did this change occur and what gave rise to it? Riccardo Saccenti attempts to answer this question.

The modern divide between natural law and natural right might appear irreconcilable. Two terms once united in a single meaning have become separate banners of competing moral outlooks. It may be, however, that the divide is not so great as it first appears. Perhaps the two words have come to reflect two sides of the same coin, whereas previously the two sides were not openly acknowledged.

John Finnis, for instance, claims that the objective notion of law and the subjective notion of right reflect two aspects of action. On the one hand, an agent must perform the action; on the other hand, there must be some object acted upon. Law emphasizes the agent acting, while right emphasizes the person who is acted upon. The law "you shall not kill" speaks to the one acting, directing his behavior. In contrast, the right to life focuses our attention upon the person who is the object of a potential act of killing, emphasizing the manner in which he must be treated or acted upon. Even rights that give dominion to an individual -- such as the right to property, which allows the individual to use the property as he pleases -- still reflect the idea that others must behave toward the rights bearer in a certain manner, not interfering with him. On this account, both law and right reflect an objective order of our actions; rights talk can be called subjective only in its emphasis upon the subject acted upon. The shift between medieval and modern times, then, might be more a shift in emphasis rather than a change in meaning.

On the other hand, perhaps something more than emphasis has changed. Perhaps the medieval tendency to focus upon the agent acting -- even while acknowledging a legitimate (although relatively rare) usage of jus that applies to the subject -- arises from a fundamentally different outlook. Before the fourteenth century, thinkers tended to conceive of human beings, and the rest of creation as well, as having some nature that was propelled, by its own inherent makeup, to certain goals and actions. This very nature, then, might be described as a "law" of behavior, since it directs to certain actions and away from other actions.

The fourteenth century saw the rise of nominalism, which dissolved this vision of a dynamic nature, replacing it with a passive subject that does not move of its own account but is moved here or there from the outside. A theologian might emphasize the will of God as the outside force moving things about. A physicist might emphasize other physical bodies as the external source of motion. In either event, the self-propelled nature disappears. So too does the internal law of behavior disappear. It no longer matters whether the agent acts in accord with his nature, since his nature moves him to no action at all. Rather, it matters how the subject is acted upon.

With this change of metaphysical outlook, not only does the meaning of "right" change; so also does the meaning of law. Of course, law still tells individuals how they must behave. The shift in meaning, then, might not be readily recognized. Nevertheless, "law" is now something disconnected from nature. It stands on its own. It no longer refers to the kind of behavior appropriate for human beings. Rather, it refers to the kind of behavior imposed upon human beings from some outside source.

Unsurprisingly, the view of any given scholar upon the precise shift that has taken place -- whether a mere shift in emphasis or a shift in worldview and fundamental meaning -- affects his analysis of the sources of this shift. If no fundamental change has taken place, then the shift might well be gradual, arising through a series of small incremental steps. If the change is more essential, then one might expect the shift to be more dramatic. If we allow that medieval and early modern thinkers are at least largely consistent, then an underlying change of worldviews will demand large dramatic changes in accounts of law and rights, rather than a patchwork of small changes.

Saccenti presents Michel Villey as the primary advocate of the large shift interpretation, while Brian Tierney is portrayed as the primary advocate of the incremental interpretation. Villey argues that Ockham, with his nominalism, is the true source of the subjective turn. In contrast, Tierney claims that Ockham does not refer to his nominalism when expounding natural right. His account of natural right depends upon lawyers rather than upon metaphysicians.

Others have entered the argument more or less on one side or the other. Francis Oakley, for instance, has an account similar to that of Villey, although he emphasizes Ockham's divine voluntarism rather than his nominalism. On the other hand, Richard Tuck analyzes the usage of jus naturale and finds a subjective usage even in Roman jurists. These two differ, it seems, as do Villey and Tierney, in what they are looking for. The former is looking for a fundamental shift, leading to an irreconcilable distinction of terms; the latter is looking for two different usages, which might ultimately be consistent with one another. Each finds what he's looking for, no doubt, because it is there to be found. There was indeed a dramatic shift in meaning; at the same time, on both sides of this dramatic shift there is found an "objective" and "subjective" meaning.

Saccenti competently surveys several other authors, each of whom is trying to determine the shift in meaning of jus naturale. He then supplies his own brief analysis, attempting to balance and unite the opposites. He acknowledges the importance of metaphysics -- or worldview -- for the understanding of the purpose and force of law, and he acknowledges that a major shift occurred in the fourteenth century with the acceptance of nominalism. At the same time, he finds an early divide between two senses of jus naturale, predating the rise of nominalism, one meaning more metaphysical and the other merely legal. Consequently, he concludes that the passage from objectivity to subjectivity is more a matter of historical accounts than it is of historical reality.

The readers should be aware that the book is precisely what the subtitle claims, namely, a survey. Indeed, it is a survey of surveys. It is a history of histories. Saccenti examines not the history of the usage of jus naturale. Rather, he examines the history of historical examinations of the usage of jus naturale. If the reader is expecting a philosophical examination of the ideas, then, he will be disappointed. If he is expecting a historical examination of the development of ideas, he will likewise be disappointed. The reader will get exactly what Saccenti claims to offer, namely, an examination of what others have said concerning a shift in meaning.

Saccenti's own analysis suffers the deficiencies necessarily accompanying any brief account. He cites a few texts but hardly provides the context needed to evaluate the fundamental meanings of the authors. Some of his interpretations appear facile, as when he finds two definitions of jus naturale in Gratian, although the texts he quotes seems to warrant the conclusion only that Gratian found diverse aspects (rather than diverse meanings) within jus naturale.

Nevertheless, Saccenti's conclusions appear accurate enough, even if they could be more clearly stated. First, he concludes that there is no dramatic change between medieval and modern talk about rights. The medievals tended to use the word jus to refer to objective obligation or some proper relation between individuals, but they also used it in a "subjective" manner that applied to the object of this obligation, that is, to the recipient of the action. As such, the shift from medieval to modern could be viewed more as a shift in emphasis. By itself, however, this explanation is unsatisfying. It hardly grasps the philosophical differences between medieval and modern political theories.

Saccenti captures this deeper difference in his account of the passage from law as a realization of a dynamic nature to law as the fulfillment of some person's will. He fails to point out, however, that this more fundamental difference effectively makes the continuity (discussed in the previous paragraph) mostly verbal. The medievals and moderns may have used the words "law" and "right" in similar manners. These similar usages, however, mask a fundamental difference in meaning. This shift in meaning can alone explain the modern propensity to "subjective" rights, since the modern worldview lacks the foundation of a dynamic nature moving the human person to fulfillment by way of a determinate path.