Debating Pornography

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Andrew Altman and Lori Watson, Debating Pornography, Oxford University Press, 2019, 323pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199358717.

Reviewed by Lina Papadaki, University of Crete


This book provides a clear, thorough. pro-and-con philosophical analysis of major issues about pornography and the debates pornography generates. Andrew Altman and Lori Watson provide strong arguments to support their conclusions, while engaging with various studies on the effects pornography has on its consumers. Their volume is an excellent introduction to the ethical issues pornography raises. At the same time, it can be appreciated by the more advanced reader already familiar with contemporary philosophical discussions about pornography.

Altman and Watson are concerned about important questions such as: How are we to define pornography? Why do we have reason to reject an obscenity based approach to pornography and to adopt, rather, a sex-equality approach? Does the right to sexual autonomy include the right to buy and use pornography? Does pornography have authority? Does pornography establish women's inferior status in making inequality sexy, or is it the case, rather, that pornography merely depicts the situation of gender inequality already present in our societies? Does pornography cause sexual violence against women in a way that justifies the claim that it should be legally restricted? How are we to interpret the numerous studies which examine the effects of pornography on people's beliefs and attitudes?

Both Altman and Watson adopt a sex-equality approach to pornography. That is, any legal restriction of pornography is thought to be justified only if pornography threatens or undermines women's equal status as citizens. They focus largely on MacKinnon and Dworkin's definition of pornography as 'the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women whether in pictures or in words'. (1997, 444) The authors carefully explain what is involved in the MacKinnon and Dworkin ordinance, which was crafted as a civil rights law, providing for five civil causes of action: coercion into pornography, forcing pornography on a person, assault or physical attack caused by a specific pornographic material, trafficking in pornography, and defamation through pornography. While Altman argues that this ordinance transgresses the right to sexual autonomy (119), Watson believes that it promotes it.

At the heart of their disagreement lies an interesting discussion about sexual autonomy. Even though both authors consider sexual autonomy to be an important aspect of our lives, they disagree on how we ought to understand it. Altman argues that sexual autonomy is an especially important basic liberty because sexual pleasure can offset the misery and hardships ordinarily present in human life. Moreover, sexual activity is an expression of intimacy and romantic love, and people should be free to control their sexual lives. While recognizing that an adult's right to sexual autonomy is part of recognizing that person as a free and equal member of society, denying a person sexual autonomy is indicative of slavery or some analogous degraded social status. The right to sexual autonomy, for Altman, includes the moral right to buy, sell, and use pornography which is produced with consenting adults. This, however, is not an absolute right. There are limits to it, for example it is not morally right to consume child pornography, or pornography made by threats of violence. (31-42)

But is the mere fact that no threats of violence were used in the making of pornography sufficient to make the women participants' consent unproblematic? Altman is not concerned with the reasons that women work in the pornographic industry. As Watson explains, women enter the sex industry (including the pornographic industry) due to conditions of inequality, and, contrary to popular belief, they are badly paid. (209)

Later on, Altman defines sexual autonomy as the right against others spilling their sticky and oozy substances (semen, vaginal fluids, mucous, saliva, etc.) onto or into you without your consent. He explains that sexual activity involves a release of these substances and, often, their transfer onto or into the bodies of others. The normal reaction to these is disgust and repulsion. However, a person's sexual attraction, coupled with the affirmation of that attraction by another (consent), can cancel the reactions of disgust and repulsion. (45-6)

Yet, it is a fact that pornography consumption has been causally linked to some men spilling their substances onto or into women without their consent, as the personal testimonies from women in the MacKinnon and Dworkin hearings reveal. Altman admits that these testimonies are entirely credible. (80) These women's sexual autonomy, then, was violated due to pornography, which indicates that we have reason not to include the right to pornography in the right to sexual autonomy.

Watson points to the fact that protecting men's right to pornography undermines the sexual autonomy of girls and women, who continue to be violated by those who have more power than they do. It also restricts the sexual autonomy of boys and men, due to pornography's pervasiveness as a tool of sex education. Pornography consumption powerfully shapes its users' beliefs, attitudes, preferences and desires. Watson puts forward a more robust conception of sexual autonomy, which includes the ways individuals stand in relation to their beliefs, desires, and preferences. (284) Pornography, she argues, distorts these and in this way undermines people's sexual autonomy and restricts the development of authentic sexuality for both women and men. (287-8)

Watson's appeal to the notion of 'authentic sexuality', however, could be taken to imply that there is an ideal kind of sexuality (authentic) and a non-ideal kind of sexuality (non-authentic). Altman rightly argues that people have a right to be wrong about what counts as authentic sexuality, and even dismiss the idea of authentic sexuality altogether. He expresses the worry that a state which uses legal prohibitions to enforce authentic sexuality is problematic because the adults do not have the authority to direct their own sexual lives. (26)

Contrary to Watson, Altman believes that pornography consumption cannot alter a person's preferences and desires, sexual or otherwise. He claims that men find women's subordination arousing. They enjoy pornography, which includes the subordination of women, because they already find subordination arousing. Thus, pornography does not make anything sexy but it deals with what its consumers already find sexy. (68-9) This is an interesting idea, which, unfortunately remains underdeveloped. Altman does not explain why men find women's subordination arousing. In fact, he admits that he does not know. The only thing he is certain of, he says, is that it has taken hold before men's consumption of pornography. (68) If Altman does not know how the subordination of women came to be considered arousing, however, he cannot be certain that pornography did not play a role in it. he needs to explain this point more, especially because Watson offers a detailed analysis of how pornography is a powerful mechanism through which sex inequality is imposed and maintained. (167-171, 285)

Perhaps the truth lies somewhere in the middle. It could be that, in some cases, pornography does not affect people's beliefs and attitudes, as Altman claims is the case with his own experience with pornography use, whereas in other cases it does. Making general claims about how pornography affects men and women should be avoided.

This disagreement between Altman and Watson regarding the effects of pornography on its consumers has its roots in their disagreement about pornography's authority. Watson shares Rae Langton's view that pornography has authority. In discussing Langton's position, as well as the objections raised by Nancy Bauer and Cynthya Stark, she puts forward an interesting argument that pornography's function (the eroticization of inequality) determines its meaning. There is no sharp divide, therefore, between the illocutionary and the perlocutionary effects of pornography. (192-4) Altman rejects the view that pornography has authority. (124-9) He argues that there is no local community in society in which pornography has authority, and it is certainly not taken as authoritative by society generally because it is considered disreputable. (125-8) Instead, he talks about great works of art by artists like Titian, Velasquez, Ingres, Giorgione, and Manet, which have authority because they are held in high esteem by society. (119, 130)

However, his criticism of Langton's position appears unfair, as she explicitly talks about pornography being authoritative for these particular hearers (boys and men), in the domain of sex. (Langton 2009, 45) The fact that pornography is considered disreputable by society in general does not undermine its authority in this particular domain. And even if we agree with Altman that great works of art are held in high esteem by society, it is hard to see how they can be of use to boys and men who want to learn about which moves are legitimate in the game of sex. Then, Altman's claim -- that it is in fact these works of art that have authority in matters of sexuality -- is strange.

Concerning the issue of violence, Altman argues that without access to pornography the male perpetrators might have committed different kinds of sexual violence, or sexual violence against different women, or at different times. What is more, he claims that the perpetrators who sexually violated women are psychologically abnormal, and not typical of the average male consumer of pornography. Finally, if pornography were absent, the men whose sexual aggression was causally explained by pornography might commit more acts of sexual aggression. According to the 'safety-valve' (or catharsis) hypothesis, men's masturbating to pornography can serve as a release of their sexual aggression, and thus become a substitute for sexual abuse in some cases. (80-5)

Not all the male consumers of pornography who sexually violated women were psychologically deranged in the ways Altman describes, however. Moreover, the fact that pornography consumption has these effects on those particular men with what Altman calls different 'basic sexual mentality' (83) is in itself worrying. As for Altman's claim that the male perpetrators might have committed different crimes if they did not have access to pornography, there is no way to know. Nor can we be certain that masturbating to pornography has a cathartic effect on those men who enjoy violence and sexual abuse. It certainly did not have such an effect on the male perpetrators who felt the desire to sexually violate real women after consuming pornography. In any case, Altman's claims about what could happen if access to pornography was restricted remain hypotheses. That pornography caused certain men to sexually violate certain women, by contrast, is an undeniable fact that cannot be ignored.

Altman also talks about experimental studies, which expose subjects to pornographic material and then seek to measure their level of aggressiveness and callousness against women. He thinks these studies are flawed because the subjects do not masturbate to climax, so the scientists measuring those variables ignore the 'safety-valve' hypothesis. Moreover, Altman mentions that the studies did not involve a random sample of men, but mostly college-age men who were unmarried and without children. (85-94)

With regard to the population-level studies, Altman believes that there is scant evidence that at the macro-level of society as a whole, as he puts it, increased access to pornography means, other things being equal, increased violence against women.

Even though access to pornography has increased in the past decades, there is in fact a decrease in sexual violence against women. Furthermore, Altman is rightly worried that the studies in question are methodologically deficient and inconsistent with one another in their conclusions. Without what Altman calls 'statistically rigorous population based studies' we cannot draw any meaningful conclusion concerning the potential harm of pornography to women. (94-103)

Altman goes on to compare pornography use and alcohol use. He argues that in the case of the latter, there is clear evidence at the social level that it causes sexual and non-sexual violence against women. On average, women are physically weaker than men, which often makes them the easy victims of drunken men. In this way, they suffer disproportionally from the harms caused by alcohol. However, adults still have a right to buy and consume alcohol. The right to sexual autonomy (and hence to consume pornography) is a more significant right than the right to use alcohol. Altman concludes from the above that there is a moral right to pornography, and that the choice to consume pornography properly belongs to the individual. (103-8)

Contrary to Altman's belief, Watson argues that the empirical evidence that pornography is both correlated and causally implicated in sex-based harms, such as increased acceptance of violence against women, acceptance of rape myths, trivialization of rape, decreased empathy towards victims of sexual assault, etc., is abundant and convincing. The negative effects of pornography increase as it becomes more violent. (221) Moreover, Watson is skeptical about Altman's idea that the pornography users' ejaculation releases their sexual aggression, rather than exacerbating it. (230)

Furthermore, Watson argues that Altman's focus on the data concerning reported rapes is problematic. To begin with, sexual violence in the form of rape is only one of the harms identified by the MacKinnon and Dworkin ordinance. Furthermore, these numbers are far from an accurate measure of sexual violence in society because rape is the least reported, prosecuted, and convicted of all violent crimes. This has to do with the acceptance of rape myths, for which pornography is responsible. (226-8) Watson argues that the real-world evidence that pornography harms women exists in the testimonies of the victims, documented in the Minneapolis hearings for the ordinance of MacKinnon and Dworkin, as well as in the subsequent testimonies by women of the ways in which pornography was used to harm them. (229-30) Watson is also critical of Altman's analogy with alcohol. She explains that the harms of pornography are discriminatory, unlike the harms of alcohol. In the case of the latter, its harms are not part of a set of systematic practices that subordinate persons on the basis of their group membership. (290-1)

According to Watson, even if we grant a right to sexual autonomy, it does not follow that this entails a right to a market in pornography that inflicts damage on others in its making and use. Watson uses an analogy with the right to self-defense, asking how far we can take it to extend. This right certainly does not entail, among other things, the right to bombs and grenades. Most people take it that the state has reasonable grounds for restricting, or even forbidding, certain instruments of self-protection, even while recognizing a general right to self-defense. (289-90)

This deep and thoughtful philosophical dialogue between Altman and Watson reveals the strengths and weaknesses of both sides. Readers, then, are in a position to decide for themselves whether the right to pornography is analogous to a right to bombs and grenades, or an important aspect of the right to sexual autonomy.


Langton, R., 2009, 'Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts', in Sexual Solipsism, New York: Oxford University Press.

MacKinnon, C. and A. Dworkin (eds.), 1997, In Harm's Way: The Pornography Civil Rights Hearings. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.