Debating Race, Ethnicity, and Latino Identity: Jorge J. E. Gracia and His Critics

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Iván Jaksic (ed.), Debating Race, Ethnicity, and Latino Identity: Jorge J. E. Gracia and His Critics, Columbia University Press, 2015, 274pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231169448.

Reviewed by James B. Haile, Bucknell University


This book is at once a project of philosophical content — that is, it is about Hispanic/Latino identity through a philosophical lens — and a project concerned with philosophical praxis — that is, the proper methods of philosophical analysis that allows the development of the philosophical content. As such, it can be and should read on multiple levels. For undergraduate and graduate students, it may serve to introduce Jorge J. E. Gracia’s work through an examination of the field of race-theory historically and contemporaneously. Junior and senior scholars, though, may be able to engage this history and the contemporary debates, but from the perspective of philosophical methodology. It is at this level that the text becomes, at least for me, both significant (to and for the field) and intriguing: at the level of philosophical methodology, the text highlights Gracia’s thought as the contribution to meta-theory and meta-philosophy in helping us to think and re-think concepts central to historical and contemporary race theory — namely, ‘race’, ‘ethnicity’, and ‘nationality’.

As I read the book, it appears less concerned with Hispanic/Latino identity, per se, and more concerned with race, ethnicity, and nationality, not for the sake of analytically understanding concepts, but for the sake of understanding the meta-theoretical and meta-philosophical aspects of the debate. The abiding question of the text seems to be, “what, if anything at all, does meta-theory have to offer to race theory?” As such, this review will not be a recapitulation of the book as a whole; rather, it will be a philosophical review of the main theme - the meta-theoretical and meta-philosophical aspects of the debate around race, ethnicity, and nationality. Additionally, since the editor himself does a tremendous job in the Preface and Introduction historically framing the text (ranging from 17th -19th century debates to the contemporary race and ethnicity debates of the 20th and 21st centuries) as well as extolling the virtues of Gracia as a philosopher, a trailblazer for Hispanic philosophy, and a friend, colleague, and mentor, another general introduction of a few sentences will suffice. For the remainder of the review, then, I will be ‘reviewing’ or analyzing and, along the way, revealing what I will claim to be the hidden or less obvious philosophical contribution of the text as a whole and Gracia’s influence for the field of philosophy as whole. Namely, I will spend what remains on the question of method, meta-theory, and meta-philosophy in the ‘discipline’, ‘canonization’, and ‘understanding’ of ‘philosophy’ itself.


Debating Race is divided into three main sections: Race, Ethnicity, Nationality, and Philosophy; Hispanic/Latino Identity; and, Hispanics/Latinos and Philosophy. Each of the sections consists of a number of critical chapters, with Gracia’s response serving as the last chapter.

The first section comprises four critical essays and mainly focuses on Gracia’s Surviving Race, Ethnicity, and Nationality: A Challenge for the 21st Century (2005). The authors focus on race, ethnicity, and nationality as concepts that can and should be understood philosophically as well as the impact of concepts (and their understanding) on the material conditions of those who suffer from and within them — namely, those that are racialized and ethnicized. The authors, Lucius T. Outlaw Jr., Linda M. Alcoff, K. Anthony Appiah, and Lawrence Blum, engage this topic from a myriad of philosophical schools of thought from critical theory, to analytic philosophy of language, and American pragmatism (to name a few). It is both interesting and important to note how different philosophical approaches affect the understanding of these concepts.

The second section comprises six authors and focuses mainly on Gracia’s Hispanic/Latino Identity: A Philosophical Perspective (2000).  J. L .A. García, Richard J. Bernstein, Robert Gooding-Williams, Gregory Pappas, Ilan Stavans, and Eduardo Mendieta attend to the meaning of identity as such, and debate the meaning and possibility of Hispanic/Latino identity. What are important within this section are the different approaches to this question. A series of meta-theoretical questions frame the section as a whole: they range between, “what is the nature of identity and the qualities of belonging?”; "what is nature of ‘ethnic’ identity as such, and how does one belong or not belong within a specific ‘ethne’?; “what does it mean to belong to an ethnic group — what are the markers of inclusion and exclusion?”; “what is the nature of the Hispanic/Latino identity? What should the markers or boundaries for such an identity be?”; and, finally, “What does it mean to be Hispanic/Latino? Is being Hispanic/Latino an identity or an ethnicity? Is there a difference between the two? And, can one actually be Hispanic/Latino as an ontological type of existence at all?” Like the first section, this section ranges in answers to these questions depending on the author’s own methodological commitments.

The third and last section comprises four authors and is focused mainly on Gracia’s Latinos in America (2008). Renzo Llorente, Susana Nuccetelli, María Cristina González and Nora Stigol, and Howard McGary, deal with the question of philosophy itself: namely, “is philosophy an objective, impassioned, reasoned intellectual interrogation, reflection, and discipline”; or, “is philosophy itself reflective of the cultural and historical values of a particular ethne?” In navigating these questions, this section asks, “what, exactly is Hispanic/Latino philosophy?”; “What does it mean to do Hispanic/Latino philosophy?”; “What are its subject matter or critical issues?”; and, “is there a particular Hispanic/Latino philosophical method?” The authors in this section raise similar questions to those in the first section concerning the nature of reflective thought on empirical evaluations, but in this section they do so with specific respect to Hispanic/Latino philosophy/theory and identity.

Meta-Theory, Meta-Philosophy, and Race-theory

Debating Race is thematized around meta-theory, meta-philosophy, and race-theory (and their inner/inter-relation) but navigates these themes in idiosyncratically new ways. It debates, along the way to the concepts, ‘race’, ‘ethnicity’, ‘nationality’, Hispanic and Latino identities (their similarities and differences), the meaning of history as social interpretation (historiography), and History (as objective fact). Gracia, as a thinker, occupies a middle or mediating position in many of these debates — critiquing both the essentialism of absolute Historical, racial, ethnic, or national identities, the cosmopolitan/relativist view, and the eliminativist or objectivist view. It is in light of this that I will be offering some, more or less, general thoughts concerning Gracia as a mediating thinker (thinker of mediation), offering the reader some short but hopefully tantalizing reasons for not only pursuing this edited collection of essays, but Gracia’s writings as well. First, I will discuss the status of ‘philosophy’ as such for race-theory. Secondly, I will address the question of meta-theory, meta-philosophy and history for race theory.

The two chapters that open Part One are from Outlaw and Alcoff. It is useful that Iván Jaksic chose to introduce the reader to the subject with “Writing a Check that Philosophy Can’t Cash” and “Mapping the Boundaries of Race, Ethnicity, and Nationality” because they help to frame the text as a whole, introducing the main themes of the text of the text as well as some of the main concepts later spelled out in the other Parts.

Outlaw begins by stating that with Gracia he has found “the comfort of good intellectual companionship,” (30), for in Gracia he has found another who believes 1) that through “critical and cogent understandings” one can “enhance living by providing the basis for recipes for praxes through which to make progress,” and, 2) that “the need is to produce clarified understandings [of the notions, race, ethnicity, and nationality], then mediate the understandings to significant numbers of significant others who take them up as guides to praxis.” (30) In other words, through the necessity to learn about the invidious aspects of racism and oppression, one will teach these things, and begin to promote better outcomes for human beings generally speaking. For Outlaw, the problem Gracia has is where Gracia locates the solution (or at least part of the solution). “Where can we turn for a reasoned response to the issues raised by race, ethnicity, and nationality?” Gracia asks.

One possibility is philosophy. Unlike other disciplines, which are narrower in scope and have developed specialized methodologies, philosophy aims to be comprehensive and lacks a single set of methodological norms. Philosophy tries to produce a comprehensive view that integrates all the knowledge we have, whereas other disciplines attempt to be less inclusive insofar as they are circumscribed by their methodological boundaries and limited subject matter (33).

Yet Outlaw is leery of Gracia’s assignment of ‘philosophy’ the task of theorizing and clarifying the concepts of race, ethnicity, and nationality, for Gracia, as Outlaw reads and cites him, not only assigns philosophy this task of clarification, but also that of ‘critique’. Outlaw contends,

is there to be one person, or some group of persons, who, as ‘philosophers,’ shall achieve this near god-like comprehensive, integrative, regulating understanding?

I say ‘No!’ No person, no collection of persons, not the variegated, uncoordinated discipline of academic philosophy today, in the United States of American and elsewhere, can cash this check. (34)

What Outlaw, though, is really asking is a more basic question: can there be a distinction between ‘philosophy’ as it is practiced in the professional sense and ‘philosophy qua philosophy’ outside of some particular historical practice? Can there be a meta-philosophy for meta-theory, or is theory always grounded within some specific historical moment of interpretation? That is, if meta-theory deals with the structure of thinking/reasoning on which arguments are bounded and meta-philosophy is a critical reflection upon the structures of thinking itself, in terms of their justification, then the question of race, ethnicity, and nationality seems to turn on the question of knowledge, but not simply as an epistemological ad-venture. Rather, the question of knowledge is the question of the possibility of distinguishing ‘fact’ from ‘living experience’, and becomes, much like Outlaw’s own work, a heuristic concern.

Similarly, Alcoff in her analysis of Gracia’s work points to the heuristic, or what she calls a Pre-Quinean aspect of Gracia’s project, which she understands to be

to address the metaphysical questions rather than the epistemological or linguistic questions that arise in regard to these concepts. And his [Gracia’s] aim is to base his metaphysical definitions on history and science, not ideology. This is laudable, but sometimes the way in which he characterizes this approach makes it sound Pre-Quinean in its formulation of objectivity as the separation of fact from value and description from prescription, with an emphasis on intentional acts. (39)

Alcoff’s reference to ‘intentional acts’, here, is important for bridging Alcoff’s chapter with Outlaw’s chapter. While Outlaw resisted Gracia’s version and value of philosophy as a galvanizing intellectual endeavor, Alcoff worries over Gracia’s assumption that philosophers “can and should mandate the proper use of terms and concepts,” which for Alcoff invokes the “imagery of Adam naming the animals in a virgin forest.” (39) In other words, to think of the philosopher as possessing the capacity for separating value and facts, is for Alcoff, to place the philosopher outside of society itself and into an ur position of critical reflection — the task of merely naming reality.

What both Outlaw and Alcoff seem to be implicitly questioning is not so much Gracia’s notion of race, ethnicity, or nationality as much as the role of meta-theory and meta-philosophy themselves for race-theory — in the understanding of concepts.

What is at stake, here, is not just the status of philosophy as such within the academy versus within the active material living world, but also, and specifically, the status of race theory within philosophy. Is race theory to be methodologically distinct from how philosophy has been taken to be or is Outlaw correct in that philosophy as practiced in America and elsewhere an inherently limited discipline, philosophers being “of the societies of which we analyze, within the political domains of meaning and interests rather than standing apart from them” (42) as Alcoff notes.

To wit, Gracia responds to both Outlaw and Alcoff,

I would like to think that Outlaw and I agree in substance, but that he has been misled by my rhetoric . . . So, is there something we can call philosophy that can do the things that I claim need to be done? Frankly, I don’t care about the name of the enterprise or discipline in question. We could call it X, if you will. Nor do I think it is unified in any rigid and well-defined way. Disciplinary boundaries are porous. Still, we need to engage in activities that aim to do the things I say philosophy should do. (73)

It seems that for Gracia ‘philosophy’ is merely a stand-in term for something larger, a meta-theoretical methodological position which outstrips, or in his term, deflates, the very boundaries around the disciplines themselves. The question remains, though, has Gracia answered the objection or merely changed the terms of the debate while leaving the central critique in place. Is it enough to claim ‘philosophy’ as a stand-in term for a general approach that aims at objectivity while acknowledging its own inherent limitations (71), enough to address the meta-critique on the possibility of knowledge outside one’s cultural understanding? This is one of the central questions readers are left to ponder.

J.L.A. García’s “Is Being Hispanic an Identity?” opens Part II, asking the meta-question on the status of belonging and how belonging may or may not be related to the ontos of ‘ethnicity’: that is, how or why those things that belong to ethnicities are ontologically distinct from those things that belong to other categories, say, a citizen or a toaster? (92) What García really seems to be asking here is the relationship between identity, ethnicity, history, and temporality. For Gracia, the question of belonging is as much an individual choice as it is a result of historical relations (and historical indebtedness) that extends far beyond any individual and his/her choices. Gracia writes,

History becomes ours precisely because of the particular history it is. It creates us as groups by uniting us and by generating relations and properties that, in context, serve also to separate and distinguish us from others. (162)

What this means, then, for Gracia is that ‘ethnicity’ itself is not a matter of just historical contingency but exists over a specific period of time, while also open and changing, yet bounded. Again, as a mediating thinker, Gracia stands in-between absolute historical necessity and historical contingency.

Bernstein counters in his chapter, “The Boundaries of Hispanic Identity”, if meta-theory deals with the structure of thinking/reasoning on which arguments are bounded, and meta-philosophy is a critical reflection upon the structures of thinking itself, in terms of their justification, then how do we justify the structures of thinking we utilize to understand and act in the (social and material) world? This question is seminal for race-theory and its future development.

If history “does not name a ‘natural kind’, if we are ‘always implicitly or explicitly’ appealing to some principle of selection in dealing with history” (108), what, then, is the meta-philosophy for the meta-theory itself? That is, Gracia, for Bernstein, “never really squarely confronts the issues of how we do and how we ought to carve up history — and why.” (108)

In other words, there are no universal “theories about ethnic determinations [to] apply to every ethnic group.” (80) Here is where meta-theory as application or praxis fails for Gracia. One cannot simply script a logical or mathematical formula for understanding the particularities of an ethnic group, as one can do with analytic statements such as “all bachelors are unmarried men.” Yet, meta-theory does offer significant insight for understanding how a particular set of circumstances can lead to a particular human expression called ethne. Meta-theory merely gives us insight into the structure or framework of thought itself, not the particularities of all thought, which Gracia notes, “involves empirical research”, and, thus, is best left to “history, anthropology, and sociology” rather than philosophy. (80) What this looks like in every situation, within every ethne, and how this can be translated into the sort of political action Outlaw requires, Gracia does not tell us. (76) Rather, he leaves us with the following puzzle:

So, rather than asking whether fact and value can be separated, or whether objectivity can be achieved independently of any subjective factors, I would like to think instead about the genesis and function of philosophical theories and the criteria philosophers use to determine their value. How do philosophical theories get formulated, what do philosophers who formulate them aim to do with them, and how do philosophers judge whether they have a good or a bad theory? . . . [these questions are] again a historical enterprise and one that yields many different results because philosophers strongly disagree on these matters, both in theory and in practice . . . I would rather tell you something about what I think should be the case. So, first, how should philosophical theories get formulated; second, what do I think their aim should be? And third, on what basis should the value of philosophical theories be judged? And let’s keep in mind that, although these are metaphilosophical questions, the context is the philosophy of race, ethnicity, and nationality. (68; emphasis in original)


What Gracia does, perhaps more than anything else, is force us to not only clarify our concepts, but also reveal and name the framework we use to generate and utilize said concepts in the world. As a mediating thinker, Gracia demands distinction of terms and positions within a debate, not their mere blanket usage. This text, though, like Gracia himself, leaves more questions asked than answered, which could, on one level be disappointing and frustrating, but could also be liberating and inspiring in that it leaves at the feet of the readers a puzzle that has be answered and challenges the readers to not only follow along, but to be engaged in the process of reading. This is what Debating Race does and does well. I hope, in part, this review does the same.