Debating Religious Liberty and Discrimination

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John Corvino, Ryan T. Anderson, and Sherif Girgis, Debating Religious Liberty and Discrimination, Oxford University Press, 2017, 343pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190603076.

Reviewed by Nicholas Bamforth, University of Oxford


This book is part of Oxford University Press's 'point-counterpoint' series, and the authors -- John Corvino (a proponent of same-sex marriage) and Ryan Anderson paired with Sherif Girgis (opponents) -- debate one another in two essays, followed by a rejoinder on each side. In a co-authored introduction, the three are clear that, following Obergefell v. Hodges ((2015) 135 S.Ct. 2071), the "most pressing question" (p. 2) is no longer "'Should government recognize same-sex marriage?' but instead 'Now that same-sex couples are marrying, while a significant portion of the country remains opposed, how can we all peacefully coexist?'" (p. 3).

In general terms, their debate therefore concerns the relative weight to be accorded to the freedoms of religious individuals to manifest their beliefs and of LGBTQ persons to be protected from unjust discrimination. A practical illustration is whether religious believers should be exempted from any legal obligation to recognise or provide services for same-sex marriages. At an underpinning level, the respective importance of religious conscience and constitutional pluralism, alongside the limits of the role of the state, are key factors.

Corvino's central argument is that religious liberty is "a core value of our nation and of any just society" (p. 103) and is reflected in US law in well-defined faith-based exceptions (e.g. exempting from vaccination requirements the children of parents with religious objections). Such liberty merits heightened attention but not unique treatment, and does not offer a licence to discriminate. However, campaigners against same-sex marriage have misinterpreted it as religious privilege, entitling traditional Christians to favour religious over secular citizens, and to place burdens on third parties due to their beliefs -- for example, through refusing to provide services for marriages of which they disapprove. This, Corvino argues, is an example of the 'Puritan mistake', whereby general religious liberty is equated with freedom to act according to the dictates of the dominant religion. "Such distortion", he suggests, "betrays religious liberty's greatest legacy" (p. 103).

Corvino favours retention of the Religious Freedom Restoration Act 1993, subject to certain modifications -- including an 'intermediate scrutiny' standard for review of laws which incidentally burden religion, and the inclusion of secular conscience exemptions. However, he is clear that majority religious groups frequently discriminate against minority groups, and thus casts a critical eye on claims for religious exemptions from generally-applicable laws.

Corvino argues that since laws ought to be applied consistently, no exemption is warranted save under limited conditions. The justification for the law concerned, the goods at stake, the burdens the law imposes and the harm its enforcement might cause, are key factors. Exemptions might be appropriate where an otherwise good law would produce serious harm, or prove disproportionately burdensome upon minorities or self-defeating if enforced upon them. As normative justifications for providing special exemptions or accommodations for religion, Corvino finds unconvincing the arguments that it is a proxy for deep, important commitments, and that believers experience religious claims as particularly binding since they understand them to derive from external, usually divine, authority. Both justifications, he suggests, are under- and over-inclusive, while a third argument -- that religion is a fundamental good, engaging basic questions and binding people together -- offers no basis for distinguishing between religious and other conscience-based exemption claims.

A fourth argument is that exemptions and accommodations can help correct religion-based mistreatment which groups have inflicted on one another historically, containing contemporary sectarian strife arising from unintentional privilege or deliberate ill-treatment. Despite describing this as "the best" reason (p. 65), Corvino believes that exemptions are only justified if other values, including legal consistency, are in play alongside the disadvantage faced by religious citizens. Furthermore, they should not burden other, disfavoured, minorities. Removing the legal requirement for a state clerk to sign every marriage licence might avoid conflict over same-sex marriages, but it would still impose a symbolic discriminatory burden on same-sex couples. Given the history of anti-religious discrimination, religious accommodations should not be used as a licence to discriminate.

Generally, Corvino characterises unjust discrimination as involving material and dignitary harm. The latter, which involves treating someone as being of inferior moral standing, receives much of its force from the social context. For much of US history, discrimination against LGBTQ persons was not merely tolerated but legally-sanctioned, and contemporary non-discrimination protections grant "a place at the table in public life" to a "long marginalized" group (p. 77). Corvino suggests that there are three paths -- none problem-free, and all unappealing to libertarian objectors to non-discrimination laws -- by which sexual orientation-based discrimination might be prohibited while allowing religious believers to express their values, thereby respecting both equality and liberty. First, certain businesses and services might simply be excluded from discrimination law. This would require the basis for any exclusion to be specified, and Corvino suggests using the nature of the service: that it is custom-provided, rather than standard. Secondly, religious exemptions might be permitted, but accompanied by the requirement that businesses give public notice of their refusal to provide services to same-sex couples, thereby providing prior warning. Thirdly, exemptions from discrimination law would not be created, but (as at present) business owners who object to same-sex marriage would be permitted to post public notices stating their position.

At the root of Anderson and Girgis's analysis is the idea of human goods: "the most basic ways in which people can be well, or flourish . . . ways of being and acting that it makes sense for us to want for their own sake" (p. 125). Examples include health, knowledge, play and aesthetic delight. Political morality in turn requires respect for all the basic goods of each person, the state's foundational duty being to empower and not encumber pursuit of those goods. Since it cannot make individuals complete in any basic good, it must allow them to pursue each adequately and without onerous or gratuitous burdens. Rules, political authority, and civil rights and liberties play key roles in this exercise.

Key goods in the present context are forms of integrity or harmony. One form concerns personal integrity: harmony within the self between one's moral (including religious) convictions and one's actions. Another involves interaction between the self and transcendent source(s) of meaning, belief and value. The good of religion consists of efforts to align one's life with the source(s) concerned. Any such relationship must be freely chosen to be authentic, so respect for a person's interest in religion demands respect for their freedom in pursuing it. In turn, we must respect the rights of conscience and religious liberty (which might encompass atheist beliefs).

The state's obligation to protect religious freedom precludes, Anderson and Girgis argue, direct attacks and needless incidental limits. If a law penalises someone for meeting their perceived moral or religious obligations, its application should merit extra scrutiny because the underlying goods -- religion and moral integrity -- are more fragile than others (being compelled to flout even a single moral conviction can shatter the good of integrity). Since the law should allow for adequate pursuit of the basic goods, it should leave citizens free to obey their conscience and religion "unless doing so would chip at other facets of the common good" (p. 136). A law which penalised someone "for living with integrity" -- for example, by keeping their moral or religious obligations intact -- should trigger heightened scrutiny, and "our presumption should be to exempt" (p. 136). Religious liberty and conscience (whether religious or secular) need distinctive and protective rules.

Anderson and Girgis suggest that the presumption in favour of liberty requires Obergefell to be implemented with the least onerous burden possible on religion. State recognition of marriage -- the concern of the decision -- can be achieved without curbing the freedom of private parties. Believers in a solely opposite-sex definition of marriage should be treated as anti-abortion doctors have been since Roe v. Wade ((1973) 410 U.S. 113): the political settlement "that has worked for four decades on abortion" (p. 113), whereby the state does not use its powers to subsidise, licence or contract to coerce consciences. Private adoption agencies, hospitals, charities and educational institutions should be free to adopt conscience-based positions concerning same-sex marriage. Coercing those with religious objections to provide wedding-related services would serve no serious need and may work serious harm. When the state can, at low cost, exempt dissenting officials from dealing with same-sex marriages, it should. Anderson and Girgis also argue that religious objections are not trumps: the law should instead strike a case-specific balance, and compromises such as allowing clerks to recuse themselves from some marriages might work.

This book delves, in an interesting and engaging way, into many complex questions. A complete evaluation is impossible, but three issues should be highlighted. The first concerns presentation: despite the lively content, the book's title is inaccurate. Conflicts involving religious liberty and discrimination potentially occupy vast areas, whereas the book pretty much confines itself to religious opposition to same-sex marriage. This is a very plausible focus, but it means a narrower title is needed. More substantively, it is foolish for the authors to focus entirely on US law when they claim to be addressing general normative questions, in relation to which there are many instructive examples from outside the US. As things stand, the book only concerns normative arguments affecting US law alone.

Secondly, despite the authors' commitment to engaging with each other, it is notable how differently they understand, and approach, discrimination against LGBTQ citizens. Anderson and Girgis suggest that moral judgments determining when discrimination is wrong relate to assessments of the rightness or wrongness of the reasoning behind it. Since law is about preserving the social conditions for flourishing, an assessment of the wrongfulness of an act is not always concerned with what the actor actually thought, but what lesson others will draw from the interaction. They also claim that it is unfair to assume that an actor's motives come from contemptuous ideas or attitudes if a benign reading is possible. In deciding whether the social meaning of someone's action justifies legal redress, we should ask how a reasonable observer would interpret the action. To justify coercion, a refusal to offer a service must be capable only of being seen as rooted in attitudes that unfairly impugn a group's abilities, character, social status or moral worth. For Anderson and Girgis, the long history of social abuse directed at LGBTQ citizens does not in itself mean that the traditional definition of marriage was part of that oppression. Also, they are not locked out of the market place, and (contrary to Corvino's argument, mentioned earlier) dignitary harms do not create a need for non-discrimination protections.

Anderson and Girgis assert that LGBTQ citizens have never faced ill-treatment as acute or persistent as that applied to African-Americans, who have a strong case for non-discrimination protection. Opposition to inter-racial marriage concerns a trait, namely race, whereas a conscience-based definition of marriage underpins refusals to provide services for same-sex marriages. Prohibiting the latter refusals would infringe upon "important personal and social goods" (p. 185) associated with moral conscience, wounding moral and religious integrity. Laws against racial discrimination do not involve similar conscience-related costs -- which constitute "our main reason for opposing" (p. 186) laws prohibiting sexual orientation discrimination.

Corvino is clear, in response, that Anderson and Girgis ignore many of the dignitary harms associated with discrimination, including the burdens traditionally placed on LGBTQ citizens (obvious examples include the threat of criminal prosecution for engaging in consensual sex, and the phenomenon of the 'closet'). They also ignore the well-documented religion-based objections made historically to inter-racial marriage: "people have used, and continue to use, religion to justify race-based bigotry in ways disturbingly similar to how they use it to justify anti-LGBT bigotry" (p. 102). Furthermore, the threshold Anderson and Girgis set for non-discrimination protections to be justifiable is so high that it is doubtful any such laws could survive, while their objections to laws prohibiting sexual orientation discrimination could equally be applied to protections for religious minorities.

Anderson and Girgis's definition of unjust discrimination is clearly contentious. It is also legally inaccurate, given that disparate impact (or indirect) discrimination relates to results rather than reasoning, as does disparate treatment (or direct) discrimination in some jurisdictions. Crucial for present purposes, however, is the gulf which plainly exists between their position and Corvino's when it comes to assessing society's treatment of LGBTQ citizens. How far the two sides are simply arguing past one another is therefore an open question. A similar observation might be made about the perceptions of religion advanced by each side. For Anderson and Girgis, "one source of the dynamism of American society is its long, vigorous respect for moral and religious liberty" (p. 150), with religion playing a unique role in relation to conscience and integrity. Corvino, by contrast, does not regard such integrity as an automatic good: religious faith has sometimes motivated people to do extremely bad things, and dominant faiths often exclude minorities.

The third issue further develops the point about underpinning differences. Anderson and Girgis frequently refer to traditional marriage as a 'one flesh union'. They do not really explain the term, but it in fact originates in the doctrinal writings of Catholic theologian Germain Grisez, mentor to conservative legal philosophers John Finnis and Robert George (both of whom also use it). It means that a husband and wife performing a sexual act with procreative potential become physically 'one flesh': a highly debatable idea (see Nicholas Bamforth and David Richards, Patriarchal Religion, Sexuality and Gender: A Critique of New Natural Law (Cambridge, 2008)). If Anderson and Girgis have a different definition of the term in mind, it would have helped if they had fully explained it. Without an explanation, it seems reasonable to assume that they are applying Grisez's doctrinally Catholic definition, making it hard to see how their argument can appeal beyond conservative adherents to their own faith. Interestingly, Corvino sometimes alludes to the difficulty of debating within a common framework: "One troubling aspect of this debate", he suggests, "is that the loudest voices in favor of religious liberty often seem all too happy to deny liberty to others when they themselves hold the power" (p. 105).

Overall, this book is a thought-provoking endeavour, and it is commendable that the authors have tried to challenge one another and to find areas of agreement. Their willingness to reach out and engage in reasoned debate is valuable in and of itself. However, they have not succeeded in reaching any real consensus, sometimes even about reference-points for the debate. Perhaps, though, their willingness to engage may be all that can reasonably be hoped for when so many components of the debate involve dispute.