Debating Same-Sex Marriage

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John Corvino and Maggie Gallagher, Debating Same-Sex Marriage, Oxford University Press, 2012, 281pp., $16.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199756315.

Reviewed by Mark Strasser, Capital University Law School


In this book, John Corvino argues that same-sex marriages should be recognized for the sake of the would-be married individuals themselves and for society as a whole. Maggie Gallagher argues that such marriages should not be recognized both because such unions are not true marriages and because she believes that the recognition of such relationships will have negative consequences. Each sets out his or her view in a main essay and then responds to the other's position in a shorter piece. While they offer no new arguments, they present their favored views in a clear and accessible style.

Corvino, a philosopher, devotes part of his essay to exposing the logical flaws in his opponents' positions. He also describes the tangible and intangible benefits of marriage. He makes a number of telling points explaining why the arguments upon which his opponents rely are circular or are over- or under-inclusive, e.g., that those who argue that same-sex couples should not be permitted to marry due to the members' inability to procreate through their union should also say that sterile couples should not be permitted to marry due to the members' inability to procreate through their union. Indeed, Corvino notes that even same-sex marriage opponents realize that individuals who are unable to engage in sexual relations may nonetheless marry, so a definition of marriage based on reproduction or the ability/desire to engage in sexual relations is at the very least incomplete.

Sometimes, Corvino's engaging style gets in the way of his argument. For example, he notes that children raised by same-sex couples are flourishing but then asks what would follow even were it true that children did best with their own married, biological parents. His response is that it would not matter -- "what would follow is that gay and lesbian couples should not kidnap children from their own married biological parents" (48), that is, the only implication involves something that is not happening anyway. He then points out that even if members of same-sex couples were not good parents, that would not be a reason to prevent them from marrying, if only because most same-sex couples don't have children. The difficulty here is not that his arguments are incorrect but that he failed to make as good an argument as he might have. Even were it true that children would do best with their married, biological parents, that would not address whether same-sex couples should parent (and of course would not address whether same-sex couples should be permitted to marry). The children whom same-sex couples parent would not otherwise be with their married, biological parents but, instead, might be in foster homes or other kinds of non-permanent placements. Or, if the same-sex couples are making use of assisted reproductive technologies, the alternative to the children living with their parents would be for them never to have existed, because the parents would not have used assisted reproductive technologies to bring children into the world so that the children could live with a different couple.

Corvino is correct that those who talk about children thriving with their married, biological parents are presenting an irrelevant argument when seeking to undermine the desirability of recognizing same-sex marriage, but he does not adequately explain why. The point is irrelevant not merely because some same-sex couples do not wish to parent but also because some do and those same-sex couples who parent are improving the lives of those whom they parent. The better response to those discussing the allegedly optimific parenting relationship is that (1) children are thriving in homes headed by same-sex couples, (2) even if it is true that children are better off with their married biological parents than with their divorced, biological parents or with their single parents, that does not undermine the claim that children available for adoption would be well-served by being placed with same-sex couples, and (3) statistics about the comparative success rates of parents simply are irrelevant with respect to who should be permitted to marry. Same-sex couples should be permitted to marry, because their marriages serve the same societal interests that different-sex marriages serve. The better answer is not that most same-sex parents won't want to be parents anyway, but that same-sex couples who will want to parent will benefit by being able to marry (as will their children and the rest of society) and that same-sex couples who do not wish to parent will benefit by being able to marry (as will the rest of society).

In a different section, Corvino does address the benefits afforded by children to same-sex parents, but fails to show why this is such a devastating argument against marriage equality opponents. He also addresses the Message Argument -- that recognizing same-sex marriage would somehow undermine the need of children for their mothers and fathers. He rightly suggests that children need their parents, but that recognizing same-sex marriage does not undermine that point. He also rightly notes that recognizing same-sex marriage need not and has not led to the parade of horrors sometimes described by same-sex marriage opponents.

Maggie Gallagher presents her understanding of the true meaning of marriage: "Marriage is the union of a man and a woman who make a permanent and exclusive commitment to each other of the type that is naturally fulfilled by bearing and rearing children together." (98) Part of the difficulty in assessing her claim is that it is simply unclear how to go about determining whether that definition is true. For example, many of those favoring (and also many of those disfavoring) same-sex marriage do not agree with that definition. That lack of agreement does not make Gallagher's definition false, but it does suggest that she should do more to establish its truth. Many who are recognized as married do not make a permanent and exclusive commitment to each other, as is suggested by Gallagher's comments about the difficulties posed by infidelity, but she does not discuss whether those people are therefore not married in the true sense. Many individuals who marry know that they either cannot or will not have children, but Gallagher does not adequately explain why they have true marriages.

Gallagher points to data suggesting that children do better with their married, biological parents than do children in single-parent homes or children in stepfamilies. That may be so, although it does not prove what Gallagher seeks to prove. Consider one of the factors inversely correlated with child welfare, namely, living in a high-conflict home. Many high-conflict marriages end in divorce, which means that the children brought up in such homes will not be counted in Gallagher's favored group (the homes where the biological parents are still married). Another factor inversely correlated with child welfare is poverty and, for a variety of reasons, a lower percentage of the poor are marrying. Here, too, many of the children raised in those homes will not be in Gallagher's preferred group. Why mention this? First, the data are skewed in favor of the married, biological parents, because the children of divorced parents and the children of single parents who are not doing as well are included in the non-preferred group. But that does not make children raised by different-sex parents better off than children raised by same-sex parents, which is the thesis that Gallagher is attempting to defend.

It is not surprising that the children in Gallagher's preferred group are doing better than other children, but this favored outcome has surprisingly little to do with whether same-sex couples should be permitted to parent, much less marry. Suppose, as seems to be the case, that on average the children born into very poor families do not fare as well as children born into wealthy families. Does this mean that we should not allow very poor parents to raise children or to marry?

The arguments presented in this volume sometimes have an anachronistic feel. For example, Gallagher discusses the definition of "mother," a term that she says refers to the woman who gives birth to the child. Gallagher momentarily considers women who adopt, but then dismisses the implications of such individuals being mothers because there would have been no child at all if the natural mother had never existed. But at least two points should be made. First, in an age where we have assisted reproductive technologies, it is not clear how to define "mother" even if we bracket those who are mothers by adoption. Is the mother the woman who gives birth rather than, for example, the one who supplies an egg? Neither families nor parents seem to fit so neatly into the categories employed by Gallagher.

Societal understandings of parenthood have been undergoing revision for a variety of reasons, including not only the use of assisted reproductive technologies but also the increase in the numbers of individuals adopting children. One of the reasons that many in our society do not share Gallagher's views of marriage and family may be traced, at least in part, to the acceptance of adoption. For example, people who marry knowing that they cannot have children together and who plan on adopting are not failing to enter into a true marriage and also are not failing to have a true family. By the same token, many couples who marry have a firm and settled conviction not to have children and they nonetheless have true marriages. The understandings of marriage and family have undergone a transformation and Gallagher's implicit views emphasizing the importance of parents raising their own biological children simply do not capture current understandings or practices.

The American family has undergone a transformation because of the availability of assisted reproductive technologies, the acceptance of adoption, the number of children born to unmarried parents, and the number of married couples who are intentionally childless. In part because of the frequency of divorce and in part because of the increased number of children living with only one or perhaps neither of their biological parents, we now have a much more complicated and diverse array of families that simply cannot be captured by the pictures of marriage and family that Gallagher paints.

Gallagher seems to think that the recognition of same-sex marriage would have disastrous effects for society. But those disastrous effects have not occurred in those states recognizing such unions. Different-sex individuals have not refused to marry nor refused to remain married just because same-sex couples are also permitted to marry. Parents have not abandoned their children just because same-sex couples are raising children. In short, the feared effects of recognizing same-sex marriage simply are not credible.

Both Gallagher and Corvino explain their positions well and offer criticisms of opponents' positions in a way that is both civil and respectful. While the arguments are not new, the non-contentious tone of their exchange is most welcome, especially because many of the issues discussed here will remain the basis of bitter dispute for the foreseeable future.