Debating the Ethics of Immigration: Is There a Right to Exclude?

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Heath Wellman and Phillip Cole, Debating the Ethics of Immigration: Is There a Right to Exclude?, Oxford University Press, 2011, 352pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199731725.

Reviewed by Michael Blake, University of Washington


Philosophical discussion of immigration is still in its infancy. We have not yet developed a sophisticated understanding of what political philosophy has to say about the rights of would-be immigrants to cross borders, and the rights of states to close those borders. Wellman and Cole have written a deeply useful book about these issues; it is more likely than any previous volume to serve as a template for how to argue about immigration.

The two authors each take approximately half the book's length -- first Wellman, then Cole -- to argue their respective positions. Wellman argues that legitimate (which is to say, rights-protecting) states have the right to close borders to unwanted would-be immigrants. Cole argues, in contrast, for a universal moral right to cross borders, such that states have no moral right to close their borders to any would-be immigrants. Their work has several virtues, only two of which I want to highlight here. The first is that they display an admirable sense of how to disagree with grace and dignity; the book is a model for how to disagree, even about foundational moral issues, without resorting to invective or ridicule. Indeed, the book might be shown to advanced undergraduates to learn the craft of respectful disagreement. The second virtue is that the arguments are well-crafted and well-presented. The book is sufficiently pruned of unnecessary technical terminology that it might easily serve as a text for undergraduate classes, but the arguments are sophisticated enough to repay the reading of professionals.

None of that is, of course, to say I agree with them. (Indeed, in a book of this character, agreeing with all of it would be impossible.) Both Wellman and Cole favor fairly blunt moral solutions: Wellman argues for a (nearly absolute) deontic right to close the borders, and Cole for the (nearly absolute) impermissibility of closed borders. Despite Cole's exhortation to avoid seeking a "compromise" solution (162), I believe some more complex set of permissions and rights is likely what is demanded. In what follows, I will first lay out Wellman's argument, then Cole's, and then discuss my worries about their views.

Wellman's argument begins with three simple premises: first, legitimate states are entitled to self-determination; second, self-determination includes freedom of association; and, third, freedom of association includes the right not to associate (13). These three are developed into an argument for a deontic right to close the borders against even the most needy would-be immigrant: if a state has adequately pursued its obligations under international justice, it can -- simply by citing its self-determination -- refuse to allow any would-be immigrant to cross into its territory.

Wellman's argument begins, then, with the idea of self-determination. Legitimate states are, he asserts, entitled to their own authority over self-regarding affairs; a country that has a less-than-optimal system of criminal law is not, in virtue of that, subject to being taken over or otherwise controlled by some outside agency (17). (If the criminal law becomes bad enough, of course, the human rights of the individuals in question might be violated -- in which case, the state is no longer legitimate.) The country would be wronged if we were to annex it, even in the admittedly rare circumstance that we were doing so in the name of its inhabitants, could actually run the criminal law better than the current institutional agents were doing, and were actually committed to democratic governance within the new country created by our annexation.

This wrong, though, seems to involve the right of a country to be free from unwanted alteration in the membership of that country. We wrong the country by denying it self-determination, and our insistence on annexing it denies it self-determination by denying it the right to control who shall be a part of that country. If this is right, though, the right of political self-determination includes the right to exclude unwanted changes in the membership of polity. This, however, entails a right to keep out unwanted would-be immigrants: the right to self-determination demands that legitimate states not be subjected to the wishes of others in determining the membership of that state.

Wellman's argument thereby defends the right of a country to exclude non-members -- even if the needs of these non-members are exceptionally great. While wealthy countries have obligations to help the members of illegitimate regimes, and the inhabitants of poorer countries, these obligations do not rise to an obligation to admit these people to membership. Instead, Wellman argues that the obligations of the wealthier countries of the world are disjunctive in form: help prevent the circumstances giving rise to such would-be immigrants through intervention and institution-building, or admit such would-be immigrants to some form of membership within one's own borders (117-124). The importance of self-determination entails the right of legitimate states to be free from unwanted members, even when those members would be benefitted enormously by membership in such a society.

Wellman's contribution includes a response to several theorists defending more open borders, a brief discussion of exit rights and the obligations of countries admitting highly skilled immigrants from developing countries, and an analysis of the moral wrongness of guest worker programs. Throughout, however, Wellman's contention is unchanged: a legitimate country may have many obligations to the global poor -- but the obligation to allow them to immigrate is not one of them.

Cole's contribution argues for the opposite conclusion. His negative argument seeks to establish that arguments in favor of the right to exclude (Wellman's included) are morally unpersuasive. Cole's positive conclusion seeks to establish that a moral right to international mobility is part of any defensible and coherent liberalism. Liberalism's refusal to endorse open borders, on Cole's account, is both a theoretical and a moral embarrassment to liberal theorists: theoretical, because we have failed to live up to the moral universalism we pretend lies at the heart of our theories; and moral, because we have not been willing to accept the radical changes that liberalism ought to provoke within our privileged and wealthy lives.

There are three threads in Cole's argument, two of which can be dealt with more briefly. The first is that arguments from analogy -- which tend to dominate within defenses of the legitimacy of closed borders -- are morally misleading. Wellman, for example, compares the right of exit to the right to be married; if I have the right to be married, it means only that I have the right to marry someone who also wants to marry me -- not that I have the right to marry whomever I happen to want (88-90). Cole, in response, notes that analogies such as these tend to blithely assume that state membership is like marriage, or other voluntary statuses; it isn't, not least in that one can survive comfortably without any spouse, but one cannot exist in security without being protected by some state or other (202-204). Arguments from analogy, says Cole, tend to ignore the fact that states are unique entities, whose unique features tend to be overlooked in such arguments.

The second thread is the historical context within which these debates are formed. We often ignore, Cole asserts, that the borders that divide the wealthy and the poor were, in large part, created by the wealthy, who felt (and feel) entitled to roam the earth in pursuit of profit (220-225). Against this backdrop, arguments against the right of the poor to cross borders seem not only unjust but unjustly ahistorical; we invoke these borders as if they were morally sacred, while ignoring the fact that they are the legacies left over from uncontroversially unjust patterns of exploitation and enslavement.

The third thread, which will require more attention, is the insistence that closed borders are morally impermissible, because these borders violate the egalitarianism that is at the heart of liberalism itself. There are, under this heading, several individual arguments Cole believes can demonstrate the incompatibility of closed borders and moral equality. The first is that membership is, itself, a good we distribute; we distribute membership in states to persons, assigning some to wealthy democratic states and others to unrepresentative and unresponsive regimes with few protections for basic human rights. For Cole, the fact that we do this is itself an issue to be dealt with by our theories of justice; we cannot think that a "just" domestic political community is fully justified, if the good of membership in that community is distributed arbitrarily among the world's population, any more than we would praise a group of racists who marginalized those of other races, yet practiced fairness in their dealings with one another (179). This argument entails that we have reason to condemn any distribution of membership that assigns greater life-chances to some people, giving them greater resources and protection -- and that then defends this distribution by giving states the unilateral right to control membership. To insist that no arbitrary facts can determine the allocation of primary goods within a country -- but to then allow arbitrary facts to determine who shall be a member of that country -- is to run into self-contradiction.

Cole similarly argues, in this thread, that the liberal insistence that states can close their borders to would-be immigrants -- but cannot close their borders to keep in their own members -- is incoherent. If emigration is morally important enough to warrant the strong moral defense we give it, both in liberal theory and in international law, then so is immigration; the one is impossible without the other, since one cannot emigrate without there being some state in which one is entitled to be admitted (197-207). If, in other words, the right of exit is to mean anything, it must include the right to enter someplace else; our refusal to see this, argues Cole, has made us hopelessly self-contradictory in our thinking about the right to exit.

Cole concludes his contribution by rejecting some more common consequentialist worries about the practicability of open borders, and by giving some initial thoughts about what a regime of open borders might look like.

As I said above, I find myself attracted to the range between Wellman and Cole: it seems that each has overstated the strength of the right he has asserted. Wellman's right to close the borders seems to overstate the strength of self-determination as a norm to be pressed against the neediest foreign citizens. Cole's right to move across borders, in contrast, seems to rest upon arguments that liberalism has reason to resist. I believe, in sum, that some more complex set of rights is likely to be more defensible in the end. In this context, though, I will limit myself to some initial remarks on the arguments in this volume.

Wellman argues that the right of a state to close its borders is deontic in character: it is defended not by consequentialist considerations, but by a moral story which makes it impossible for this right to be overridden by competing considerations. Wellman does allow that the right is not absolute, but it is instructive that his example here is one of catastrophe: the right might be overridden in the case of nuclear war (35-36). This right is, in other words, so strong that it can be overridden only by the sorts of hypotheticals that we might invoke to justify overriding the right to be free from torture. Why, though, should we think that the freedom of association is sufficiently important to ground rights of this sort?

Wellman's answer seems to be that those who are members of a group legitimately care about its future direction, and the admission of new members changes the nature of that group and the policies it is likely to make: "since a country's immigration policy determines who has the opportunity to join the current citizens in shaping the country's future, this policy will matter enormously to any citizen who cares what course her political community will take" (40). But it seems hard to think that these considerations, however weighty, give rise to anything like the strong deontic rights discussed here. Imagine, for example, that the members of one demographic group begin to have children at a rate that alarms the members of a dominant majority. Can a legislative majority, in the name of shaping its country's legislative future -- and preserving a particular form of life -- prevent the members of that community from having babies, through compulsory contraception? Can they simply cite the fact that they do not want these prospective members "entering" the community as a reason to impose this policy?

The answer, of course, is no, which Wellman would readily accept; it would be dramatically unjust for the government to coercively prevent the births. This, however, shows us that the right to control the membership of a country is not the deontic right imagined; it is, in contrast, a right that might sometimes be trumped. Our democratic right to "exclude" the unwanted babies fails, immediately, because of the competing value of reproductive autonomy. My worry is, though, that once we admit that there can be such competing values, the right given by Wellman isn't anywhere near as strong as he believes it to be. Self-determination, on the view I hold, is justly limited by the considerations of liberal egalitarianism (which include, but go beyond, reproductive autonomy). If this is right, then it seems to me that these considerations can extend beyond the border, to the people who are at the border, trying to come in. Cole is right, I think, that liberalism ought to have a global reach, and that the would-be immigrant cannot count for less in a valid liberal framework. If this is true, though, it seems that immigration policy cannot simply cite self-determination as a trump against the needs and wishes of foreign citizens; they are morally equal to insiders, and their exclusion stands in need of justification to them. This means, in the end, that countries cannot regard immigration as simply an "internal matter" (29) over which they have discretion; the right to control unwanted members is limited by the other rights implied by liberal equality, and Wellman cannot think that the right to freedom of association is nearly so strong as he supposes.

I cannot work out what all this would entail here, but I believe it would at least demand greater immigration rights for individuals facing serious deprivations in foreign countries. Wellman allows countries to, as it were, purchase the right to exclude: a state that has done enough elsewhere can exclude even the neediest persons who want to cross its borders. I am not sure that this is adequate. If we recognized that the right of freedom of association was not as absolute as Wellman believes, then I think it is at least plausible that a state might lose the right to cite this value as a justification for returning a would-be immigrant to circumstances under which his most basic human rights were unprotected. This might be true, moreover, even for a virtuous country that was doing enough elsewhere (which, of course, none are.) All I would insist upon at present, though, is that the right to exclude Wellman insists upon here seems unjustifiably strong.

As I said above, I disagree with Cole's proposed right as much as with Wellman's; indeed, my disagreement with Cole seems considerably more thoroughgoing. I would begin by noting that Cole's picture of distributive justice -- in which membership is a good to be distributed, and whose distributions may only be justified with reference to the patterns of life-prospects produced -- seems to me to be an unattractive picture. Wellman condemns this picture as reflecting a luck-egalitarianism we have reason to reject; Cole argues that this picture could be derived from a democratic egalitarianism not unlike Wellman's own (184-185). Whatever one thinks about this particular exchange, it seems true that Cole's picture depends upon thinking that the distribution of life-prospects is relevant from the standpoint of justice in any number of contexts. Cole argues as if the fact of a difference in life-prospects is generally to be regarded as presumptively unjust, until justified with reference to some principle we have reason to accept. If a distribution is the result of something arbitrary, in other words, we have reason to redistribute until no undeserved benefit or burden is to be found.

This is a coherent picture, and I can understand why some find it attractive; for those of us who reject it, though, Cole's argument simply can't get started. Rawls's response, for instance, would be to say that membership is not itself a good whose distribution is to be evaluated by distributive justice; rather, membership in a territorial state is required before his theory of distributive justice has applicability. Rawls's The Law of Peoples allows for inequalities between states, even if the borders between them are arbitrary and the distribution of people between them is morally arbitrary; this reflects not a refusal to apply liberalism to international justice, but a particular vision of how the notion of justice ought to be understood. For my part, I would say only that Cole's vision depends upon theories like Rawls's being wrong; Cole's argument depends crucially upon inequality being presumptively unjust when it is produced by morally arbitrary differences between persons. Those who -- like Rawls -- disagree with this presumption cannot accept anything that follows.[1]

Considerations like these lead to a more basic disagreement with Cole: why, exactly, is a closed border a violation of moral equality? Picture two people, each of whom has access to the best government available; each is adequately protected against standard threats, has an adequate range of options, and so forth. Now, imagine that one wants to move from her country to that of her neighbor. Why, exactly, is it a violation of equal concern and respect when the second country refuses to admit her? She has, after all, the protection of any and all rights we might imagine in her home country. More to the point, it seems as if she and her neighbor are being treated differently because they are, in relevant respects, different -- which is not a violation of equality, but the very definition of it. Her neighbor is subject to the law of the second country; she wants to become subject to it. She wants to abandon her current set of legal institutions, and acquire a new status within a new set of legal institutions; her neighbor doesn't want to change anything of the sort. Even if it is, in some odd sense, "arbitrary" that she was born in her own country and not that of the neighbor, does it not make moral sense that the different relationship she has with the political and legal machinery of her neighbor's country will make it at least plausible that we might refuse to admit her to this new status? Equality, understood in its proper sense, does not demand that everyone have the same rights; I, for example, have no right to vote in French elections, because of the (admittedly arbitrary) fact that I was not born there. This is not a violation of equality, but instead an implication of it. Those who are subject to the law of France should have the right to control its legal and political institutions; outsiders should not have the same rights. Why can we not say something similar about the case of immigration?

At this point, I think Cole might reply that our example is highly atypical: in the real world, immigration involves keeping people in low-income countries from leaving their homes and coming to more high-income countries. We ought to keep these real people in mind. This is, I think, entirely true -- but I am not sure that it will help Cole's case. Cole seems, here, to be confusing two different ways of defending immigration rights. We might defend these rights as ways of protecting against the persistent violation of other rights -- rights to be free from poverty or oppression, say. Alternatively, we might defend these rights as rights that are important in themselves, much as we defend the right to free choice of occupation or the right to freedom of religion. If we focus on the facts of international poverty in our defense of immigration rights, we have to face up to the fact that the best response to this poverty may not be a universal right, given to everyone, to go anywhere they want to. A human right to cross borders, for example, would likely entail that rich Americans should have the right to go to Cuba, or Nicaragua, or Haiti, and purchase land on the same terms as the locals. While this might be defensible, it is far from clear that it is the only -- or the best -- response to the facts of objectionable poverty in these countries. The people who have been subjected to the violence of history, whose countries are neither representative nor rights-protective, might have rights in virtue of this to cross borders to escape from poverty. But all this involves the development of particular rights, whereby some people have somerights to cross some borders. We have no reason to think that we can, from these materials, develop a universal right of the sort Cole defends.

I have, in this review, sought to demonstrate that the development of a more complex sort of immigration right -- by which some people properly have rights against legitimate states to cross borders, and by which legitimate states properly have rights to exclude others -- might be a necessary next step in our debates about immigration. Nothing I have said here, though, should be taken as diminishing my admiration for the work done by Wellman and Cole. The book should (and will) receive a wide audience, and we may hope that the debates surrounding immigration will be more fruitful for its existence.

[1] Cole also seems, to my mind, to underestimate the ways in which liberals might distinguish between the right to enter and the right to exit.  It seems as if denials of the right to exit presuppose a single agent coercively insisting upon the right to continue coercing.  If we focus on the standard risks individuals face from government power, we might think that the right to exit emerges as more of a check against government abuse, rather than as a right valuable in itself.  I cannot give this the full attention it deserves here, though.