Decolonizing Universalism: A Transnational Feminist Ethic

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Serene J. Khader, Decolonizing Universalism: A Transnational Feminist Ethic, Oxford University Press, 2019, 186pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190664206.

Reviewed by Kathleen Stock, University of Sussex


In this book, Serene J. Khader steers an assured, creative, and scholarly course between two points she seeks simultaneously to reject. The first is a Western feminism saturated with imperialist and ethnocentric assumptions. The second is a wholly relativist position which, along with its repudiation of Western feminism, rejects the possibility of any universal feminist norms or prescriptions. In their place, she argues for a transnational feminism, with a universal 'normative core'. Yet, interestingly, she also describes a theoretical approach with the apparent flexibility and resources to avoid, not just tacit imperialism and ethnocentrism, but also any blanket incompatibility with religious tradition and gender complementarianism, for instance. Thus, enticingly for those concerned to maintain transnational feminist unity, her feminism promises to avoid automatic confrontation with many non-Western ethical traditions, including some patriarchal ones.

Khader's strategy depends on starting with a fairly minimal conception of feminism. She defines this as 'resistance to sexist oppression'. She draws upon Marilyn Frye's conception of oppression, understood as 'a set of social conditions that systematically disadvantages members of one social group relative to another' (p.5). Such oppression is universally and so transnationally a bad thing, according to Khader. However, importantly, it is not the only bad thing; there are other forms of oppression to be fought simultaneously, and sometimes feminism will be deprioritised blamelessly by women whose oppression derives from multiple sources, not just sexism. This is likely to be the case in the Global South, for instance.

Equally importantly: how sexist oppression, specifically, manifests in a local cultural context will vary, and will require local context-sensitive solutions. What might work as a solution for women in a Northern country with a market economy, mobile workforce, and welfare state, is unlikely to work in a Southern country with very different conditions. Furthermore, since oppressive contexts tend to bundle together both harms and certain advantages for its victims, there may be reasonable disincentives for those victims to act against specific sexist harms. For doing so may bring, along with such action, greater chances of personal disaster. Via these and other well-taken points, Khader builds her case against single, thick, ethnocentric conceptions of 'gender justice'. She urges feminists to pay attention to the detail when developing practical responses to sexist oppression in particular contexts, rather than illegitimately extrapolating from their own.

As is to be expected given the power differentials involved, in the first part of the book Khader focuses on reasons why Western feminists might be especially prone to thinking of their local situation as a global one, to harmful effect. Building on a theme of Uma Narayan, Khader's antagonist is the 'missionary feminist'. This is a somewhat caricatural or 'stylized' persona (p.23) that, Khader recognizes, 'few feminists explicitly endorse' but one which they may well unconsciously resemble, nonetheless. The missionary feminist thinks West is best, endorses a false Enlightenment narrative of moral progress towards modernity, fails to interrogate the West's imperialist history, endorses an individualistic liberalism as a universal moral vernacular, prioritises relatively non-pressing interventions for non-Western women as universal priorities, and idealises away the costs of such interventions as they play out in real situations. She's also insensitive to the sorts of political compromise often forced onto women struggling with multiple intersecting forms of oppression, demanding all-or-nothing 'justice achievement' rather than 'justice enhancement'.

Still, against those within decolonial and postcolonial traditions who would reject the idea of universal normativity as itself an artefact of pernicious missionary feminism, Khader maintains that one can reject missionary feminism, and indeed any particular allegiance to a culturally thick conception of gender justice, whilst admitting a limited number of universal and transnational norms as essential to feminism. The solution, as indicated, is to define sexist oppression as -- universally -- the systemic social disadvantage of one gender in relation to others; but also to acknowledge that what 'goods and powers' constitute disadvantage and advantage will differ from culture to culture.

For instance, in sub-Saharan Africa, the feminized ability to produce food has bargaining power it doesn't have in more industrialised countries (p.39). Equally, where income generation via a job might, for a British wife, increase her independence and so her well-being, in a different cultural context it might be used to legitimise her husband's withdrawal from domestic tasks, or even to subsidize his polygamy (p.54). Whereas physically leaving the community in which her domestic abuser resides might be optimal for a woman in a Western society, this might not be the case in a society where well-being is strongly dependent on kinship and community bonds, and social mobility limited (p.56). With the key point convincingly made that concrete goods and harms, and indicators of advantage and disadvantage, are to be defined locally, and need not travel, the remaining chapters undertake to show how various phenomena often thought inextricably linked to feminism -- certain varieties of individualism, secularism, and gender conservatism -- are in fact sometimes compatible with it in particular contexts.

With her intense focus on the real-life contextual detail against which feminist politics takes place, Khader's work is reminiscent of the theoretical tradition of ethical particularism, itself historically aligned with feminism via the tradition of care ethics. However, she here maintains distance from full-blown particularism via her insistence that at least one thing -- namely, oppression, in its various forms -- is generally wrong. In terms drawn from the debate between particularists and generalists, we might say that forms of systemic oppression only have 'valence' in one direction -- a negative one. Equally, Khader acknowledges the existence of a limited number of universal goods, including 'freedom from violence', 'the ability to determine one's reproductive life' (p.39) and literacy (p.40). At the same time, she apparently recognizes no hierarchy of value or disvalue amongst goods or harms, which might then dictate priorities in a particular case of decision-making. In this aspect, her view is reminiscent of a form of Rossian generalism, according to which there are a number of prima facie duties, non-hierarchically ordered, so that one cannot tell, in advance of inspecting local context, which one should predominate in a particular decision-making case. Equally, Khader insists that only a very general articulation of goods and harms is possible, and one that will underdetermine practical action in a particular context: for 'societies genuinely vary in their currencies of advantage' (p.39) and 'One cannot know whether sexist oppression is present in a given case without knowing the overall effects of certain social practices, which in turn cannot be understood without rich contextual information' (p.41).

Khader's insistence -- that what many Western feminists take to be direct access to general ethical reality might well be, at best, relevant only to their own parochial context, and at worst, distorted and false -- must be right. What is less clear is why the same should not be said, in principle, of any feminist prescriptions located unreflectively in a particular cultural context; particularly when one acknowledges the fact, well-known not least via earlier work of Khader herself, that adaptive preferences -- including those of feminists, of all backgrounds -- are formed in response to sexist conditions. Though it's no doubt a rhetorical corrective to the dominance of colonialist ways of thinking, at times Khader's apparent deference, via her choice of examples, to the judgements of non-Western feminists about particular practical dictates, and her near-exclusive focus on the biases of Westerners, tends to obscure this more general epistemic point.

For me, one of the most interesting things about Khader's approach is the extent to which, alongside other work on adaptive preferences, she gives us a rich range of resources with which to understand otherwise seemingly inexplicable choices of women, when considered in abstraction, and where they apparently perpetuate sexist oppression, either of themselves or others. Such choices, she shows us, might in particular contexts sometimes be fully recognisable as rational. For instance, women might be responding to distinct forms of oppression other than sexism. Equally, women might be rationally choosing what they think of as the least-worst option; or prioritising only those goals they judge practically achievable, or those which won't expose them to undue risk (p.75).

I appreciate the move away from moralising and towards rich psychological understanding of women's choices under patriarchy; though it then seems strange to see moralising reappear in places, as a response to the missionary feminist who is this book's apparent cartoon villain. Here the authorial tone becomes rather more condemnatory. This seems particularly strange given that nearly all the examples of missionary feminist attitudes are drawn, not from academic writing, but from responses of non-academic Western audiences to the work of the Afghan Women's Writing Project (p.23). If, for instance, women in these audiences 'discuss how lucky they are to live in a country where they can shop and wear makeup' (p.24), or 'fail to prioritize changing global structural contributors to "other" women's oppression' (p.27), it doesn't seem to me obviously blameworthy, given the generous psychological terms offered to us by Khader to understand the origin of such thoughts, feelings, and choices, generally. This is not, of course, to say such thoughts, feelings, and choices are true or optimal. A great virtue of this book is the room it makes for a clear distinction between what is true and good, and what is believed or felt. It is only to draw attention to the slightly jarring, somewhat polarising way in which the Western woman seems to be given disproportionate moral responsibility for her epistemic faults in the book, compared to others.

Moving on: there's little doubt that Khader's challenge to over-simplifying, over-generalising feminist practices, pursued unthinkingly in the name of women generally, but in fact of benefit only to some of them, is a highly effective one. For this reader, though, one perhaps unintended effect of the book is the generation of an increasing sense of paralysis about effective feminist decision-making at a local context. Part of what Khader makes indirectly clear is that every practical decision to improve women's lives, in the name of feminism, will have a cost to some others. This isn't surprising: if feminism is, at least partly, a future-looking movement aiming to remove systemic oppression and so reconstruct present social arrangements, then it is clear that some women will have to suffer now, in order to move towards a better system later (not least because of the aforementioned existence of preferences adapted to present sexist circumstance). Let's assume that feminists can, with a lot of self-reflection, get past each of their/our own sets of culturally-generated biases and adaptive preferences, in order to access objective moral reality. Still, in deciding what to do about that reality, we have to weigh up all the respective harms and benefits of available feminist actions, in what Khader shows us is a very messy world.

And perhaps the world is messier than even Khader acknowledges. She understandably tends, as indicated, to focus on examples articulating the negative implications of the imposition of Western feminist strategies in non-Western contexts. However, as one would perhaps expect, those examples are strewn with qualifiers: 'often' 'some', 'sometimes', 'may' and 'might'. For instance, we are told (my italics): 'Bedouin women can be harmed through changes in kinship structures that remove support for care' (p.55); 'the world outside the community may have little to offer women' (p. 56); and 'Women . . . who . . . flee forced marriage and other forms of gender violence often experience religious and racial harassment . . . in domestic-violence shelters' (p.57). In other words, for many of these particular strategies, even despite their bluntness and apparent ill-fittingness, it is reasonable to assume they brought benefit to some, harm to others, and were value-neutral for still others. Cultural forces are just one set of causes, and they don't completely determine outcomes.

To see the potential paralysis more clearly, consider a rare moment where Khader positively rules out a concrete practice as unambiguously antithetical to feminism, regardless of context. This is the inculcation of the idea, believed by some Salafi Muslims, that unmarried women 'are damaged goods or do not deserve social benefits' (p.91). Khader writes that this idea is 'simply antithetical to feminism'. Yet I found myself wondering: how can she be so sure? Admittedly, on the face of it, to my untutored eyes, such a belief looks squarely like one that props up sexist oppression. But given Khader's wider argument, couldn't possession of this belief conceivably benefit the women that had it, in the context of a sexist and traditionalist society? Couldn't the advantages of such a belief even, in some local contexts, possibly outweigh the disadvantages? (Or, perhaps more in keeping with other examples of Khader's: couldn't the disadvantages of rejecting such a belief, in terms of ostracism from the local community and a consonant decrease in a woman's social power, outweigh the disadvantages of possessing it)?

Perhaps anticipating this worry about moral paralysis, in her final chapter Khader writes that 'in a world characterized by the injustices of sexism and imperialism, Western feminist refusal to [morally] judge amounts to a refusal to take seriously their moral responsibilities to oppose the forms of domination in which their position renders them complicit' (p.132). (Here we find the incongruent move to moralising language described earlier). She then offers what she calls 'normative guidelines' for 'assessing feminized power under nonideal conditions' (p.132-142). These are sensitive enough, but hardly stave off the original worry about paralysis: they stress that 'different strategies will be effective in different contexts' (p.134), that norms should be 'culturally undetermined' and should consider 'change over time' (p.135). Arguably, what Khader is pointing to is simply the complexity of good, sensitive, effective ethical decision-making, generally. For those steeped in a tradition of woman-centred practical activism, this may all seem somewhat efferent. Nonetheless: in an increasingly polarized, unsubtle world, the insightful and psychologically realistic approach of this book to women's oppression is a welcome one, and many of its insights highly compelling.