Decomposing the Will

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Andy Clark, Julian Kiverstein, and Tillmann Vierkant (eds.), Decomposing the Will, Oxford University Press, 2013, 356pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199746996.

Reviewed by Marcela Herdova, King's College London


Decomposing the Will is a collection of 17 papers that examine recent developments in cognitive sciences in relation to claims about conscious agency (or lack thereof) and the implications of these findings for the free will debate. The overarching theme of the volume is exploring conscious will as "decomposed" into interrelated functions. The volume has four sections. Part 1 surveys scientific research that has been taken by many to support what the editors refer to as "the zombie challenge". The zombie challenge stems from claims about the limited role of consciousness in ordinary behavior. If conscious control is required for free will, this recent scientific research, which challenges conscious efficacy, also undermines free will. In part 2, authors explore various layers of the sense of agency. Part 3 investigates how to use both phenomenology and science to address the zombie challenge and discusses a variety of possible functions for conscious control. Part 4 offers decomposed accounts of the will.

Due to limitations of space, I will offer extended discussion of only a handful of papers. I provide a brief description for the remaining papers.

The introductory paper by Tillmann Vierkant, Julian Kiverstein and Andy Clark lays out the main themes of the collection. However, it does more than merely summarize the issues surveyed by the volume, and critically engages with relevant literature both within and outside the collection. I will point out a couple of claims that we should be cautious about. One has to do with the nature of compatibilist accounts of free will. The authors claim that 'Most compatibilists think that some form of control is what is special about freedom. . . . in most accounts it seems to be assumed that it is consciously exercised" (5). Further along, the authors suggest that the compatibilist identifies conscious control as necessary for free will. However, it is not the case that compatibilist accounts typically appeal to this kind of control. Consciousness is rarely mentioned in metaphysics of free will literature (for instance, John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza's Responsibility and Control or Derk Pereboom's Living Without Free Will do not index consciousness at all). Importantly, it is not obvious that a compatibilist (or even an incompatibilist) needs consciousness to be involved in action in any significant way. While it is plausible that freedom requires some sort of control, it is not clear that it requires conscious control. Take for instance the reason-responsiveness account: a well-functioning reason-responsive mechanism does not require that the reasons to which it is to be responsive are conscious (or that we are conscious of relevant reasons as reasons for or against a particular action). Not being conscious of reasons does not entail that we do not discern and engage with reasons in an appropriate manner.

Another claim to consider pertains to conscious action initiation (discussed in relation to prediction experiments; John-Dylan Haynes, this volume): "If we live in a world where our capacity for conscious control is idle and does no work in initiating action, this is a world in which the conscious self makes no difference" (6). As the authors correctly remark further on, action initiation is one of the key concepts associated with free will and is widely discussed in relation to prediction and timing experiments. However, it is a stretch to suggest that the lack of conscious action initiation suggests that conscious mental states do not make a difference to how we act. Unconsciously initiated actions may still be consciously controlled in virtue of more distal conscious causes. For instance, research on implementation intentions, pioneered by Peter Gollwitzer, is a good illustration of how we can control behaviour in virtue of distal conscious causes where action initiation itself may be unconscious. Also, one can argue that we control behaviour in virtue of standing intentions and habits; both of these plausibly involve cases where one makes a conscious decision to act in the future and the target action becomes automatized over time in a way which does not require further conscious involvement at the time of initiation. So, the fact that an action is initiated unconsciously does not, on its own, suggest that no conscious states are relevant to performing the given action. As for free will, there is no reason why only proximal conscious causes (or their absence) should be relevant to whether we act freely. Therefore, it is too demanding to require conscious initiation for free will, even if some sort of conscious involvement is required for free will.

These considerations lead me to John-Dylan Haynes's paper on choice prediction experiments. The upshot of this research is that we are able to predict both the timing and the outcome of some simple decisions (left/right button presses). Haynes explains the predictive accuracy is around 60% and can be improved significantly if the decoding is custom-tailored for each participant. I will focus here on the implications of these findings. These findings are supposed to undermine the "naïve folk-psychological intuition that at the time when we make a decision, the outcome of this decision is free and not fully determined by brain activity" (68). One could suggest, in response, that we simply do not have such intuitions (however interpreted), or even if we do, it is not relevant enough that our intuitions may be undermined -- given that the correct theory of the role of decisions in action might have very little to do with pre-theoretical views. Other than what these results may or may not tell us with regards to our naïve views, do they suggest that our decisions are not free in some important sense?

We first need to understand what 'determined by brain activity' means in this context. Sometimes Haynes seems to be concerned with the nature of the relationship between mental and physical states. For instance, he claims that the "the deterministic, causally closed physical world seems to stand in the way of 'additional' and 'unconstrained' influences on our behavior from mental faculties that exist beyond the laws of physics" (60). If the worry is presented this way, the results will be troublesome only for those who hold that free decisions require some heavy duty Cartesian metaphysics.

In what other way might it be problematic that decisions are determined by brain activity? One concern may be that decisions are not some sort of prime mover, the first cause with no causal antecedents. This could be problematic for noncausalists about free actions. However, the majority of both compatibilists and incompatibilists are happy to embrace that decisions have unconscious causal antecedents.

The most worrisome interpretation of the results is that conscious decisions may not be relevant to what we do given that we are able to predict, with some accuracy, the course of our actions before we consciously decide to act. This seems to be in line with the suggestion that the findings "point toward long-leading brain activity that is predictive of the outcome of a decision even before the decision reaches awareness" (67) and that the "brain can begin to unconsciously prepare decisions several seconds before they reach awareness" (68). If consciousness and/or conscious choices are delayed in this way, does this mean that we are not free in our decision-making in some robust manner?

As previously mentioned, the fact that our consciousness might play a limited role in action does not immediately undermine free will. Even if, in the discussed scenarios, it is determined unconsciously what we are going to do, we still need a further argument to show that this is detrimental to free will. There are different ways to argue that it is not. One is to suggest that free will does not require making decisions consciously, across the board or just in simple movement cases. If we come to have intentions unconsciously, but the intentions we come to have are related to our long-standing preferences, dispositions and character traits, it is not obvious why such action-generating process would be 'depersonalised' and detached from our rational and reflective capacities in a way that would threaten free will.

A different worry is that the above data fail to say anything about decisions -- a case can be made that no decisions are made in experimental tasks that only involve simple motor movements. Given the experimental set up and the nature of the task, it may be that subjects execute the tasks without having to make decisions -- and if they do make decisions about what to do, these are not the kind of decisions we make outside laboratory circumstances. While it is true that, unlike in Libet's experiments, subjects are to determine not only when to act but also what to do (which adds to the complexity of the task and may make it less artificial), such left/right hand selection is still an insignificant task. Given that it has no relevant pragmatic or moral implications on an agent's other actions or plans, it is not clear why decisions, conscious or unconscious, would be required for these actions.

Manuel Vargas aims to explain how research on situationism and automaticity threatens what he calls Reasons accounts of free will and moral responsibility. According to these accounts, "an agent's capacity to appropriately respond to reasons constitutes the agent's having the form of control that (perhaps with some other things) constitutes free will or is required for moral responsibility" (326). Vargas's solution to the situationist challenge rests on abandoning certain assumptions found in Reasons accounts.

I take issue with some claims that Vargas makes in support of the view that Reasons accounts are threatened by situationism. Vargas claims that irrespectively of how we characterize reasons, it would be problematic if (a) "we seldom acted for reasons", or (b) "if it turned out that there was a large disconnect between conscious, reasons-involved deliberative powers and the causal mechanisms that move us" (326). According to Vargas, this is precisely what some research in neuroscience and social psychology points to. While I agree that it is bad news for our responsibility practices and free will if (a) and/or (b), it is not straightforward that the discussed research points to this. Take the Samaritan experiment (Darley and Batson, 1973) in which subjects happen to run into someone who is in need of medical attention. What made a sizeable difference in whether subjects helped or not was how time-pressured they were (some were told to hurry while others were given more relaxed instructions). It seems implausible to say that subjects did not act for reasons -- arguably, those who failed to help did not do so precisely because they reasoned they had only little time. If that is true, it is not the case that subjects' conscious deliberative mechanisms were disconnected from causal mechanisms that moved them. The same point seems to apply to Milgram's obedience experiments (1969). It seems plausible to assume that, at least on some occasions, subjects complied with experimenters' instructions precisely because they judged it best to comply with instructions issued by authoritative figures 'in the know'. This also seems to contradict how Vargas describes the typical situationist cases, as scenarios in which subjects deny or dismiss the relevance of the circumstantial factors to one's decision-making process. Many other examples usually given in support of the situationist challenge fail to fit that description, and as such they do not seem to present a special challenge to free will and moral responsibility.

Further, it is wrong claim that "Seemingly inconsequential -- and deliberately irrelevant -- features of the context or situation predict and explain behavior" (327). This is not just because of the point above. Even if subjects deem some salient contextual features as irrelevant to their decision-making, it is oversimplified to say that situations enable us to predict behaviour. The situational cues are hardly of a compelling nature. At best, they make a certain course of action more probable; the context cues do not propel one to act. The fact that situational cues might raise probabilities of acting in a certain way is not problematic as such. In scenarios where people do not deny the relevance of the situational cues, it only suggests that different people are inclined to evaluate certain reasons in a similar fashion and factor them accordingly into their decision-making process.

Let me conclude with some glosses on the remaining articles. In Part 1, Adina Roskies maps out the scientific literature on the neural basis of volition and evaluates how neuroscience might help us with the question of compatibility of free will and determinism. Mele examines whether neuroscientific research supports the idea that we can veto conscious intentions, decisions or urges, and concludes that the current research does not suffice to establish that we possess such a capacity. Richard Holton compares doctrines of determinism and of predictability, explaining why the two should not be run together.

In Part 2, Manos Tsakiris and Aikaterini Fotopoulou argue that the experimental paradigm in which subjects are asked to judge whether they have caused a relevant sensory event is not a suitable tool for investigating the experience of agency since this fails to help us understand the experience of initiating and controlling actions. Shaun Gallagher argues for the thesis that there is genuine ambiguity in the experience of agency and further suggests that it also has a social dimension. Fabio Paglieri proposes that there is no positive experience of freedom; our judgments about acting freely are based on the absence of coercion. Tim Bayne makes a case for the thesis that intentional, goal-directed agency is a marker of consciousness and contrasts this with the claim that only introspective report is a reliable guide to the presence of consciousness.

In part 3, Ezequiel Morsella, Tara Dennehy and John Bargh argue that consciousness enables a "cross-talk" information exchange, between competing action-generation systems. Nico Frijda proposes that the function of conscious will is to resolve conflicts of emotional nature that arise when there are concurrent incompatible emotional inclinations. Sam Maglio, Peter Gollwitzer and Gabriele Oettingen explore the role of emotional experience in action control while focusing on comparing anger and sadness and how these activate different processing styles. Wayne Wu aims to show how we can hold together two apparently incompatible claims: that automaticity implies the absence of control and that agency often requires automaticity. Joëlle Proust argues for the thesis that mental and bodily forms of action are two distinct natural kinds and proposes that, in contrast with bodily action, an instrumental and an epistemic motive must be present in order for a mental act to develop.

In part 4, Vierkant discusses the distinction between evaluative and managerial control, arguing that the latter requires the ability to meta-represent and is central to free agency. Lars Hall, Petter Johansson and David de Léon relate the problem of self-control to intentionality and introspection and discuss how findings from their choice-blindness experiments support an interpretative framework of self-knowledge for intentional states.

Overall, this is a well-rounded and balanced selection, which offers much needed cross-discipline debate.