Deconstructing Dignity: A Critique of the Right-to-Die debate

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Scott Cutler Shershow, Deconstructing Dignity: A Critique of the Right-to-Die debate, Chicago University Press, 2014, 205pp, $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780226088129.

Reviewed by Catherine Mills, Monash University


Political and moral debates about euthanasia and the claimed 'right-to-die' are amongst the most emotive and bitterly fought internationally, in part because the question of whether there is a right to die (and its legitimate parameters if there is) tests some of our most basic intuitions about personhood, moral status and the question of living well. As Scott Cutler Shershow skilfully analyses, the concept of dignity holds a peculiar place in this debate in that both those in favour of a right to die and those opposed to such a right draw upon it to support their positions. But the question of what dignity actually is, and why it is seen to require certain moral and political responses, is far from resolved. In fact, as Shershow argues in this book, the concept of dignity bears within itself a double logic, whereby it points to something unconditional and beyond all price -- something incalculable -- and something the value or worth of which is context-dependent and relative, that is, something calculable. Building on this insight, he goes on to argue that this double logic of the incalculable and calculable also structures the debate itself, where both proponents and opponents make reference to each of these in their arguments for and against the right to life.

To make these arguments, Shershow engages in several different tasks throughout the book; first, in a lengthy first chapter, he elaborates a methodology or 'protocol' taken from Derridean deconstruction which subsequently guides his analysis. As he points out, this chapter can be skipped over by those readers less interested in the intricacies of Derrida's comments on deconstruction as a method. The following three chapters elucidate the concept of dignity, revealing its various ambiguities and contradictions. These chapters take the forms of a conceptual analysis that reveals the intersection of dignity with cognates such as sanctity and sovereignty, and an historical analysis that traces the philosophical development of the modern notion of dignity. Only two chapters in the book engage significantly with recent developments in the debate on euthanasia and a right to die. One of these maps the logic of calculation and incalculability at work in arguments made by both proponents and opponents of a right to die. The second of these extends this analysis, particularly through integrating an analysis of sacrifice as the figure through which a calculative logic "infects" (121) the unconditionality otherwise invoked.

In the first chapter, "Methodological Introduction", Shershow engages closely with Derrida's comments on the deployment of deconstruction as a weak method or protocol, and outlines the argumentative strategy that he will henceforth deploy in the book. Two moments of the deconstructive protocol are significant. The first is the identification of an original opposition that is revealed as a "violent hierarchy" in which one term of the opposition "governs the other" (Derrida cited, 10 and 11). The second moment is the "irruptive emergence" (citing Derrida 11) of a new term that is somehow implicitly linked with the subordinate term in the original opposition, and which disrupts or deposes the original opposition. This brief account of deconstruction suffices to reveal the overall structure of Shershow's argument, in which the original opposition in the concept of dignity is that between the incalculable and the calculable, and the new term implicitly linked to the latter appears to be that of "just care".

Within this overall structure, the three chapters following this methodological one are then dedicated to delineating the concept of dignity and the double logic of incalculability and calculability that appears to plague it. The first of these chapters focuses on the intersections and oppositions drawn between dignity and sanctity, while the second undertakes a similar analysis of dignity and sovereignty. Shershow argues in these analyses that dignity is revealed to be simultaneously "absolutely unconditional and absolutely conditional" (35) insofar as the meaning of the term encompasses something taken to be intrinsic to the human being, and a status attained by some humans and not others. Further, it is "always in need of supplementation, and threatened by a certain groundlessness or incompletion" (51). These characteristics, he goes on to show in the fourth chapter, are also evident in the philosophical history of the concept, from Cicero to Kant. This history provides background to the various appeals to dignity in the contemporary right-to-die debate, which repeat the ambiguities and double logic of the concept, apparently without much recognition of the ways in which incalculability and calculability -- unconditionality and conditionality -- entwine in it and thereby come to structure the debate.

Perhaps the most novel and enlightening contribution of the book, though, is the way it shows that this logic not only pertains to the concept, but structures the very debate on the right to die. In Chapter 5 of the book, Shershow illuminates "a precarious structure of argument both within each side's case and within the debate as a whole, a structure that turns on a set of relations between the conditional and the unconditional, between calculation and incalculability." (85) In true Derridean style, Shershow analyses the way in which the primary arguments on both sides are traditionally couched in terms of the unconditional, but supplemented by arguments about contexts and conditions and the necessity of calculating amongst them. Thus, he claims that ultimately even the primary arguments about unconditionality are fractured by the "logic of calculation" (86). For example, he claims that those in favour of a right to die argue that this right is the "ultimate instance of the autonomy and freedom of human beings, the final, absolute, and decisive expression of the reason wherein consists . . . the incalculable value of human dignity" (87). However, this claim to the unconditional is supplemented by the argument that a right to die would free up scarce medical resources that could be better utilized elsewhere. Shershow finds evidence of the co-existence of these arguments in the work of bioethicists in favour of a right to die such as Peter Singer and John Hardwig, the latter of whom raised the question of whether there was in fact a duty to die in certain circumstances.

Shershow further explores the connection between incalculability and calculability in two remaining chapters on sacrifice. The first of these is again historical, tracing the distinction between suicide and sacrifice through the ages from Plato to Kant, while the second maps the logic of sacrifice in contemporary debates. The point of these chapters is to show that self-sacrifice operates as a kind of exception that continually disrupts the historical prohibition against suicide, and as a consequence, a "sacrificial economy" (101) always conditions arguments made for and against a right to die. Sacrifice thus comes to play a key role in the right-to-die debate, though its centrality is far from widely recognized. Shershow argues that sacrifice is the "paradoxical site where a calculative economy infects that very unconditionality that is otherwise being invoked" and further, "sacrifice embodies in itself the economy of calculation and incalculability that seems to structure this entire debate" (121). This chapter lucidly examines landmark cases in the right-to-die debate, namely those of Karen Quinlan, Nancy Cruzan and Terry Schiavo, to bring out the way that the struggles for and against death waged over the vegetative bodies of all three women ultimately cast them in the light of martyrdom.

At this point, Shershow has completed the first part or step of the deconstructive protocol he adopts -- the deconstruction of an original opposition understood as a violent hierarchy. What remains, however, is the "irruptive emergence" of a new term, which he suggests -- and merely suggests -- might be "just care". This is by far the least developed aspect of Shershow's argument as it is only addressed in the final few pages, and the "quasi-concept" of just care is only identified in the final paragraph of the book. In this brief sketch, just care amounts to something like "a mutual commitment to each other that, having on the one hand made possible the maintenance of life to its mortal limits, could, on the other hand, also make it possible to think or recognize a decision for death" (174, italics in original). Further, such a death would have to be "absolutely anything but a 'sacrifice'" (175, italics in original). Unfortunately, this is the extent of Shershow's discussion of just care, and in my view the analysis overall would have benefited significantly from a more extended discussion of the implications of this thought, even if that meant excising other aspects of the book such as a somewhat digressive discussion of arguments, including Derrida's own underdeveloped comments about human cloning.

Throughout the book, Shershow's analysis is both insightful and clear -- there is little turgidity, and the analysis is not overburdened by more or less abstruse commentary on deconstruction. The analysis largely follows the protocol or weak method outlined in the first chapter, but it is neither necessary to read that chapter nor to understand Derrida's version of deconstruction to appreciate the points that Shershow makes in subsequent chapters. In this, the book may appeal to a wider readership and has considerable potential to contribute to bioethical debates on euthanasia and the right to die. Even so, Shershow does not explicitly present the book as an intervention in bioethical debates, and, for me, this points to one of its main weaknesses. For while engaging with normative arguments, he himself seems to shy away from making normative claims -- at least explicitly -- or developing the normative implications of his analysis and especially the notion of just care.

Continental approaches to bioethical issues have become increasingly well-recognized in recent years, but this work is frequently characterized by a tendency to withdraw from explicitly normative engagement. In keeping with this eschewal of the normative, Shershow adopts a kind of intellectual distance from the very debates that he seeks to engage. To put it another way, he comments on those debates, but does not exactly enter into them. The kind of analysis that this yields is of course legitimate -- and often valuable -- but in this instance at least it does strike me as something of a missed opportunity. This is particularly so since Shershow's own sympathies seem to show through at more than one moment. For instance, his critique of the arguments posed by those who embrace the principle of the sanctity of life and the correlative notion that humans are mere stewards of the life given by God -- a position that he describes as "entirely untenable" (93) -- is somewhat more acidic than that posed against the bioethicists named above. Thus, at times it seems he wants to adopt a position, but not defend it.

Further, Shershow's analysis of contemporary debates is limited to a fairly narrow spectrum of legal cases around the right to die -- primarily Quinlan, Cruzan and Schiavo. This American-centric view is not explicitly acknowledged, though, and one wonders how readily the analysis might extend to other contexts, ones perhaps less determined by the discourse of individual choice as the apogee of dignity on the one hand, and religious conceptions of sanctity of life on the other. To what extent, for instance, does the logic of incalculability, calculability and sacrifice transfer to recent international debates and cases, such as Belgian twins who requested -- and received -- euthanasia following a prognosis of blindness? The recent legal changes to allow euthanasia of children in Belgium may also highlight the particularities of the American context of the debate. Certainly, such an analysis of the American context may be revealing in itself, but Shershow claims to be approaching "the debate about a right to die as a whole" (x). Doing so, however, would require both a much broader and a more specific analysis of the debate as it plays out in different contexts. Such analysis would also have to recognize the contribution that other concepts such as medical futility, decisional competence, quality of life and unbearable suffering play in the debate. It may be too much to expect any single analysis to do all of this work, but what I think this points to is the potential simplification involved in a deconstructive analysis that must first construe a complex discursive field in terms of a key conceptual opposition in order to show the fault-lines in that opposition. To be clear, a deconstruction of the way that the concept of dignity is mobilized in the American right to die debate is valuable in itself -- but this does not amount to, and should not be posed as, an analysis of the "modern debate" about euthanasia and a right to die "as a whole".

Despite these criticisms, though, Shershow's book does an admirable job of extending the field of Continental, and particularly deconstructive, approaches to bioethical issues. It demonstrates the way that deconstruction can elucidate the stakes of apparently intractable debates and, in that, reveal new possibilities for thinking. One hopes, then, that his contribution to the debate will help to generate some clearer thinking around the right to die and its conceptual underpinnings.