Deconstructing Zionism: A Critique of Political Metaphysic

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Gianni Vattimo and Michael Marder (eds.), Deconstructing Zionism: A Critique of Political Metaphysics, Bloomsbury, 2014, 189pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441105943.

Reviewed by Shaul Magid, Indiana University Bloomington


Deconstruction: A strategy of critical analysis associated with the French philosopher Jacques Derrida (1930-2004), directed towards exposing unquestioned metaphysical assumptions and internal contradictions in philosophical and literary language. Zionism: A movement among modern Jews having for its object the assured settlement of their race upon a national basis in Palestine; after 1948, concerned chiefly with the development of the State of Israel. This is how the on-line OED defines the two terms that constitute the title of this collection.

One assumption of deconstruction is that under close investigation, ideas, theories, even ostensibly coherent sentences, collapse in self-contradiction. This need not lead to a nihilistic conclusion, although among some deconstructionists it does, but rather an understanding of the complexity and messiness of any product of the human mind and a charge to investigate claims that are made and, in this case, theo-political consequences that are drawn from those claims. Deconstructing Zionism does not argue that Zionism is "false" or "evil" by definition. It does argue that Zionism is immersed in self-contradiction, for some irredeemable self-contradiction, that needs to be exposed and examined.

As defined in the OED Zionism has a very narrow scope. It is a recent movement to establish a nation-state in historic Erez Israel as a homeland for the Jewish people. It does not define that nation-state as a "Jewish" state. Nor does it address its theological, historical, or political roots. And it says nothing of the reality of its implementation.

One could assume that, as a method of investigation, deconstruction could apply to many, or all, things, e.g., metaphysics, literature, race, gender, class, nationalist ideologies, etc. Why not Zionism? Zionism is essentially a European nationalist ideology based on the viability of the nation-state, a post-enlightenment idea that Jews picked up on in the wake of enlightenment's failure to assure them equal status in their countries of origin (here the Dreyfus Affair may have served as its initial flashpoint, the Holocaust, its final confirmation). The essays included in Deconstruction Zionism do not deny this maligned reality nor do they deny the plight of the Jews historically. But the contributors do take up a deconstructive posture on the question of Zionism's applied viability, not only in regards to the occupation in 1967 but to the state's very founding in 1948.

Many of the scholars included here are based in Europe or work on European ideas, which in many ways undergirds the volume. Thus, Deconstructing Zionism is, in large part, a Eurocentric "deconstructive" project even as some contributors are American or teach in American universities. That is, this volume's critique of Zionism is also a critique of the nation-state more generally. Zionism may be the target because, as Tony Judt suggested in his oft-cited essay "Israel: The Alternative" (The New York Review of Books, 2003) Israel is to some extent a remnant of the ethno-centric nation-state which many claim has become or is becoming passé. To some extent this may be true. But one cannot read anything about Zionism these days, for or against it, that is not also a partisan attempt to weigh in on the various linkages that accompany today's use of the term. Linkages include: Zionism, Judaism, anti-Semitism, Holocaust, "Jewish" state, etc. These terms are often linked, overtly or covertly, in many Zionist and anti-Zionist writings and political statements. It is one of the macabre ways Zionists and anti-Zionists agree.

One of the constructive (as opposed to "deconstructive") dimensions to this volume is that it is a sustained attempt to investigate and problematize these linkages as a way to "deconstruct" the Zionist narrative as it plays itself out in today's discourse in ways that are far more complicated and messy than the definition offered by the OED. Critics of Zionism today walk a fine line. The linkage between anti-Zionism and anti-Semitism is fully operational, and thus an anti-Zionist position must be carved with care. While anti-Semite hunters abound, investigating every passing reference with skepticism, it is also the case that the resonances of antipathy, animosity, and even outright hatred of the Jew remains deeply embedded in the Left, especially in Europe. This is not to accuse any of these essays as expressions of that, but some, for example, the essay by Gianni Vattimo, come dangerously close. When Vattimo refers to the missiles fired from Gaza into Israel as "totally harmless missiles" (17) (those "harmless missiles" created widows and orphans) and openly likens "the problem of Israel" to "the original sin spoken of in the Old Testament, the Hebrew Bible" (21), we seem to be talking about something more than a critique of religion, theo-politics, or the national-state. We seem to be talking about "the Jews."

Alternatively, when Slavoj Žižek observes that the Zionist pact with fundamentalist Christians "who are, as it were, by their very nature anti-Semitic" (3) coupled with the way Jewish anti-Zionists today are maligned by Zionists as "self-hating Jews," produces what Žižek calls "Zionist anti-Semitism" (6), if we can get by the intentionally provocative language, he has a point. That is, Zionism and Judaism have fused such that to be anti-Zionist, even as a Jew, precisely as a Jew seems almost equivalent to being "against the Jew qua Jew" (one definition of anti-Semitism). In Žižekean fashion, Žižek turns the discourse on its head claiming that it is the Zionists, in order to defend their ideology at all costs, who are becoming "anti-Semitic." Interestingly, Daniel Boyarin made a similar claim about Theodor Herzl in his Unheroic Conduct.

Most of the other essays in Deconstructing Zionism avoid such provocative language and dialectical inversion but inhabit an often thoughtful anti-Zionist position (even if you do not agree) that includes sharp criticism of the linkages suggested above, especially between religion (Judaism) and Zionism, but also between Zionism and the actual Israeli (not "Jewish") state. The question of dispossession looms large here, as it should, and this may be the crucial deconstructive key. The phrase "A land without a people for a people without a people" first appeared among Christian Restorationists as early as 1843 but became a Zionist credo in its iteration by the British playwright Israel Zangwill in 1901 ("Palestine is a country without a people; the Jews are a people without a country"). While false, the sentiment of this credo has not fully disappeared, even among those in favor some form of a "two-state solution." This is aptly stated by Michael Marder when he writes, "This is not to say that Zionism was 'blind to the presence of Arabs in Palestine'; rather, it was (transcendentally) blind to the justifications of and the right to their presence" (158).

In some way, to take this book at face value one must suspend one's sense of Realpolitik (if that is even possible anymore) and look at Zionism as one would look at anything. The State of Israel today is enmeshed in a series of complicated dilemmas, only some of which are a product of the ideology that bought it into existence. It may be constructive to look at Zionism as part, but not the sum total, of where Israel stands today. Zionism is a legitimate desire for self-determination among a historically maligned people and simultaneously "a colonial appropriation of the land of Palestine, now embodied in a Jewish state that seeks to displace Palestinian life and culture in our homeland." (102). Thus, perhaps if Zionists could step out of their defensive and apologetic posture, while maintaining their legitimate claims, they may readily see the seeds of Zionism's own deconstruction.

This does not suggest Israel as a nation-state should cease to exist, and I don't think Deconstructing Zionism, as a volume, argues for that. Perhaps the volume suggests that if Israel is to survive as a nation-state, it must uncouple from Zionism and reevaluate the contours of its own construction. Yes, Israel will look very different, but that is not necessarily a bad thing. For Zionist partisans, Deconstructing Zionism will simply be another case of radical left genteel anti-Semitism. For those who are invested but less convinced of the continued efficacy of the Zionist narrative, and who believe "immanent critique" is a useful tool of analysis, Deconstructing Zionism provides astute, if sharp, perspectives on the future of the term "Zionism" in a world of continued globalization. Zionism brought Israel into existence. But that does not mean, by definition, that it must continue to be the engine of its survival.