Deconstruction and Democracy

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Alex Thomson, Deconstruction and Democracy, Continuum, 2005, 208pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826475779

Reviewed by Matthias Fritsch, Concordia University


Most path breaking and suggestive work in philosophy faces the problem, at least initially, of an unsatisfactory reception: it is celebrated by the faithful but misunderstood and dismissed by the impatient. This is true in particular of writing that both questions the supremacy of authorial intention and is highly performative, seeking not only to argue its content but to enact its insights. Certainly Derrida's work is a case in point, even if his more recent work, much of which deals with urgent ethical and political matters, is not as disseminative as some of his earlier work, work that meant to show that not even the author can control and anticipate its meaning (one thinks of Glas and The Postcard). As a result, Derrida scholarship finds it hard to get beyond the disjunction between critical yet unfaithful and faithful but not (yet) sufficiently critical and probing responses. While the former, as reactions to his death about a year ago amply demonstrated once more, is often too impatient to avoid setting up a straw man to criticize, the latter, while clearly to be preferred, tends to be so close to Derrida so as to content itself with explicating his arguments rather than also questioning their basic assumptions and effects. Calling for improvement in regard to this state of scholarship would not have to neglect the Derridian point about the inevitability of being both faithful and unfaithful at the same time, that is, the insight that every response is an interpretation which goes beyond the text to which it responds, no matter how hard it tries.

Alex Thomson's book-length study of Derrida's largely recent work on democracy clearly belongs to the second category. Readers of this text will benefit from Thomson's enormous grasp of both Derrida's oeuvre and key figures without whose engagements it would not be what it is. But for the most part they will not find critical questions put to Derrida's arguments, even the most crucial arguments regarding, for example, the claim that ethical and political concepts are necessarily beset by aporias that require any responsible decision to pass through an ordeal of undecidability. Thomson remains exegetical even when he confronts Derrida with different or even rival theories; his guiding assumption always is that Derrida is right and his theory does not stand to gain from additions or rearticulations, even in cases where his book lacks the space to give others a fair hearing, from Levinas, Lefort, and Laclau to Mouffe, Benjamin, Nancy, and Lacoue-Labarthe. This might be disturbing given Thomson's suggestion as to the hospitable openness inherent in Derrida's own reading practice. On the other hand, given how much we still have to learn about Derrida's incisive contributions to political philosophy, Thomson's faithful approach is helpful in part for the very reason of this neglect. He considers a wide range of later Derridian texts on ethics and politics, thereby allowing us to see its multifaceted, cross-pollinating richness as well as its perpetually rearticulated structures.

The book is divided into four parts, only the first of which -- strictly speaking, only its first chapter -- deals specifically with what the title of the book promises, to wit, an attempt to explicate a deconstructive concept of democracy. Of course, we now have available more material by Derrida on 'democracy to come' -- in particular, Rogues -- than Thomson had at the time of writing the book under review here; such early datedness is the inevitable risk specifically of writing on a then living author. In this sense, it is understandable that Thomson focuses on texts not specifically dedicated to democracy to investigate Derrida on politics in general, rather than pursuing the notion of la démocratie à venir more directly and analytically.

The introduction to the book discusses the various senses of Derrida's claim, "no deconstruction without democracy, no democracy without deconstruction" (1), in particular by showing that there is nothing narcissistic about it in so far as deconstruction is at work in phenomena, including political ones, rather than being a theoretical movement of Derrida's single-handed invention. The first chapter reviews some themes from The Politics of Friendship, which Thomson sees as Derrida's "most extensive political work" at the time and thus uses as a guiding thread throughout (1, 8). Here, the aporias of political friendship in general are transposed to democracy to yield an analysis of its inevitable self-delimitation: if democracy is a promise of universal inclusiveness, of each singular one counting equally, its fraternal or national limitation on members naturalizes the ineluctable decision of inclusion and exclusion. Repoliticizing this decision may thus lead to an experience of undecidability at the heart of any necessarily bounded democratic 'community.' Such an aporetic experience would prevent democracy from ever imagining itself equal to its concept: given the constitutive but irreconcilable demands its very idea harbours, democracy is an unfulfillable promise, thus remaining, like all meaning, infinitely deferred, always 'to come' from an unanticipatable future, and 'spectral', that is, hovering between absence and presence. Although it is not set up this way, the rest of the book may be seen as fleshing out -- once again, not analytically but by closely following their occurrence in other Derridian texts and contexts -- the ensemble of claims and concepts thus introduced: universality and singularity, brotherhood, nationality, and exclusion, depoliticization and repoliticization, community and openness or hospitality, originary violence and the promise of non-violence.

The second chapter then leaves The Politics of Friendship to consider Derrida's reflections on democracy and the modern institution of literature, seen as the very embodiment of free speech. Thomson justifies this turn to literature by arguing that it allows us to counter the charge that Derrida abstracts too much from "contemporary political events" (31), though one may think that there would be better ways to do this. Most obviously, one could -- and Thomson indeed does this later in a different context -- demonstrate the intimate connection between the supposedly abstract and conceptual analysis of democracy and Derrida's frequent interventions in political events, whether these concern, for instance, South African apartheid or the status of refugees and immigrants, or his call for urgently needed reforms of international law.

To deepen the understanding of Derrida's position in the first part, however, Thomson goes on to briefly contrast it with Laclau's and Mouffe's 'radical democracy', which he, for the sake of comparison, largely reduces to Claude Lefort's arguments about democracy and totalitarianism. The major argument seems to be that Derrida's democracy to come (a) is situated at a higher level of political analysis, from which (b) one could show that the aporetics of democracy disallows the strong opposition between democracy and totalitarianism that is said to be so crucial for the three thinkers in question. In addition, the more abstract position is said to permit Derrida to (c) theorize a promise of nonviolence needed to see politics as a violent struggle for hegemony in the first place. While the latter is clear from Derrida's explicit response to Laclau, it is neither obvious that this requires a more abstract analysis -- many aporias seem precisely to follow in part from Derrida's insistence on the ineluctable contextuality of politics, for example, its always already having made, historically, a decision about inclusion and exclusion -- nor that Lefort, Laclau, and Mouffe set up a binary division between democracy and totalitarianism. Laclau in particular has appropriated Derrida's notion of undecidability so as to also question any purity in democracy, whether radical or not. But as indicated, Thomson is here not interested in treating thinkers other than Derrida with the same principle of charity, a decision within what we may name the politics of interpretation that calls for some justification despite the overarching aim of explicating Derrida on politics. Following his account of Derrida's politics of reading, to which the next part turns, the decision to "read Derrida's work in the manner in which he reads", would call for an acute awareness of the injustice thus committed (6).

The second part (chapters 4, 5, and 6), then, precisely seeks to argue that Derrida's textual practice itself is governed, more or less consciously, by a politics of reading. Titled 'Deconstruction as Political Practice,' Thomson here deciphers Derrida's interpretations of philosophical nationalism, of Heidegger, and of Kant on cosmopolitical hospitality as themselves examples of performative political practice. Chapter four pursues this objective by considering Derrida's writings on nationality and his own relation to the French language, the language of the colonizers of Derrida's native Algeria which nonetheless became his own. Derrida's overall argument here is that, similar to what we saw in friendship, choosing to privilege one's 'own' language is both inescapable, a decision taken for the subject by 'the other,' and yet violent for its neglect of other languages and idioms. Such an aporetic structure is also reflected in philosophical nationalism's logic of exemplarity: as the discipline of the universal, philosophy ought by right to be above nationality, but its uncircumventable tie to a 'natural' language often leads it, as in Fichte and Heidegger, to proclaim universality to be exemplarily expressed in a particular: in one nation, one language, or the idea of Europe. The next chapter then pursues this logic as well as the objective of demonstrating deconstruction to be a political practice by singling out Derrida's reading of Heidegger. In reminding us that Derrida does not claim to escape Heidegger's exemplarism, Thomson shows that the former's politics primarily calls for an awareness of this double entanglement in order to more consciously, and thus perhaps less violently, negotiate it (79-81). In this sense, chapter six focuses not so much on the content of Derrida's many writings on hospitality -- although the crucial relation of hospitality to democracy might have suggested a more extended treatment -- but on the attempt to view them as themselves being welcoming of otherness. If Kant's cosmopolitan hospitality, so central to many contemporary debates about global justice, is limited by the priority of truth-telling and reciprocity, thus excluding those without state protection -- those persecuted by a state and those lacking citizenship, today's sans papiers --Derrida confronts these limits with limitless, unconditional hospitality from beyond the state and its borders (94). In light of this unconditional hospitality, Thomson considers Specters of Marx's proposal for a new form of global resistance -- dubbed the New International -- and Derrida's work on refugees as deconstructive interventions.

If state politics is to be questioned in the name of an unconditional ethics, then one might think Derrida criticizes politics in the name of the ethical, in the manner of Levinas. However, this widespread view is rejected by Thomson, who instead argues in the third part that, beginning with his reading of Levinas in 1964, Derrida actually pits politics against ethics (103). Thus Thomson proceeds to revisit the earlier and later phases of the debate between Derrida and Levinas. He first explicates Totality and Infinity and Derrida's response in "Violence and Metaphysics" with a focus on the notion of an economy of violence: Levinas's pure peace in relation to the transcendent other -- the ethical -- is reinscribed by Derrida in such an economy, which only allows for gradations, not for a binary division, between violence and nonviolence on the level of describable events. The upshot is that for Derrida, the ethical relation is not the foundational and peaceful origin of politics and the latter not the violent occlusion of ethics. Rather, both are as differentially related to one another as are totality and infinity. While ethics inscribes an alterity within politics, politics contests the 'narcissism' of the exclusive face-to-face relation of ethics. Chapter eight pursues these differences in the later work of Levinas and Derrida and, despite some modifications, finds this conclusion confirmed, especially in relation to Levinas's notoriously problematic comments about the Israel-Palestine conflict.

The fourth and last part of the book then treats the relation between repoliticization and depoliticization alluded to above. Deconstruction reactivates decisions that, by way of historical sedimentation, have been depoliticized and come to be seen not as decisions, but as natural or unquestionably rational. We have already mentioned the case of political friendship being construed in the limiting terms of nature, nation, and nativity to yield a seemingly natural account of a nation of born brothers. Deconstruction repoliticizes these exclusionary decisions precisely by depoliticizing (in a second sense of the term) the traditional meaning of politics and opening it toward an excess that it cannot contain: unconditional hospitality, the hyperbolic, unchosen, and subject-enabling responsibility toward the other (or rather, otherness), justice toward the singular other not captured by always general laws, and so on. In order to delineate the relation between re- and de-politicization, Thomson begins by tracing Derrida's critique of Carl Schmitt, whose use by Chantal Mouffe might have provided him in an earlier chapter with better ways to criticize, from Derrida's perspective, Laclau's and Mouffe's antagonistic account of politics. If, according to Schmitt, the political is the unity of friends defined by war with the enemy, but such war is only a possibility that Schmitt surreptitiously attempts to turn into something more 'real' or 'actual', then the political never settles into a form with clear boundaries. It remains 'spectral', as Derrida will say, subject not only to the uncertainty of who the enemy is and whether the enemy is external or internal to the polity, but open to the friend-friend grouping not being defined by an enemy at all. In this sense, the political is depoliticized, a fact that, as Thomson notes, Derrida does not, like Schmitt, deplore but affirm (159), for it shows the totalitarian closure of the political to be impossible, thus keeping it open to what will arrive from the future. The last three chapters pursue the spectrality of politics and the consequent interplay of re-and de-politicization further with regard to the notion of undecidability and of the retrait of the political. The final chapter then seeks to argue, against leftist critics like Žižek and Negri, for the virtues of Derrida's "refusal to advance a positive politics" (185) in order to remain open to an unpredictable future, an openness said to be needed in order not to foreclose and renaturalize political decisions by proposing a new, nonspectral, even if revolutionary ontology.

Allow me to add a few overall critical remarks that bear precisely on the question of proposing horizons of politics. Thomson knows, but does not sufficiently reflect on, the fact that Derrida's work on ethics and politics, as also at least that of Nietzsche and Heidegger, takes a "step back behind the ethical" (Negotiations, tr. Elizabeth Rottenberg, Stanford University Press 2002, 223) in a concern to think the "nonethical opening of ethics" (Of Grammatology, tr. G. Spivak, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1974, 140). In Derrida, the step back inquires into (quasi-transcendental) conditions of possibility as at the same time conditions of impossibility (hence, the aporias besetting moral and political concepts, of which Thomson speaks in many places). This means that, for the most part, the notions of a friendship prior to particular friendship (aimance), of unconditional hospitality, of justice, and so on, are not in the first instance, and strictly speaking, moral concepts, but conditions of normativity in general. Derrida suggests, for instance, that différance makes the ethical or political subject possible in the first place, but in such a way as to bind it both to specific horizons of intelligibility as well as to the non-horizonal, infinite deferral of the 'subject's' identity indicated in the idea of the unanticipatable future to come. As a result, unconditional hospitality or infinite responsibility are not in the first instance a normative demand, but a fact: no host can predict the guest's behavior and no subject can be thought other than as an infinite exposure or response to the future that opens it to 'the other' in the sense of implying necessary but unforeseeable changes in the subject.

When it comes to refuting those who, like David Wood, have questioned the resulting infinitization of a hyperbolic responsibility, Thomson recognizes this: "So this is not an ethics, a prescription … ., but a statement of a structural condition" (67). As in his defence of Derrida against leftist critics at the end of the book, he pushes this line of thinking so far as to claim that Derrida does not engage in normative prescriptions at all, which would always be mere machine-like programs neutralizing decisions, but performs a style of ethics reminiscent of Gandhi: leading by example rather than arguing for the other's normative obligations (100). In other places, however -- for example, when attempting to demonstrate the advantages of Derrida's account over Laclau's -- Thomson argues that Derrida teases out the promises analytically contained in, for example, the concept of democracy and condenses them into the normative "ideal" or "principle" of democracy to come, against which actual politics might be judged (25, 26, 28, 38). Such an immanent criticism based on an ideal or a regulative idea would then be beset by yet another problem: Derrida's aporetic logic, the thought of conditions of possibility as conditions of impossibility, shows that the ideal cannot ever be attained for structural or conceptual, not merely for empirical, reasons. This leads Thomson to write: "Democracy to come is what makes democracy what it is -- the principle of equality or emancipation attested to by the name of democracy -- but, like aimance, it is immediately effaced … Yet it provides a principle against which any state which claims to be democratic may be judged". After referring to the intrinsic aporia between equality and singularity (which Derrida presents in "Force of Law", a text not extensively discussed here), he continues: "It should be clear by now that Derrida must not be taken to be arguing for an ideal of democracy which no actual or empirical democracy will live up to, or which a democratic theory could describe" (26, but see 147).

The need for clarification in these passages would thus pertain, first, to the relation between quasi-transcendental conditions and normative ideals, including the question as to whether Derrida makes ought-statements at all and if so, from what they are derived; and, second, the possibility of basing critique on an ideal while knowing it to be impossible to be realized and even to be described. In other words, the relations among quasi-transcendental conditions, normative horizons, and the absence of a horizon named the 'to come' call for further interpretive as well as analytical work. I doubt neither that Derrida's writings indicate at least some of the above claims Thomson attributes to him -- in other texts on Derrida, it is in fact often overlooked that Derrida calls for both regulative ideals and their contestation in the name of the future to come -- nor that they are relevant to a deconstructive account of politics, especially if analyzed more persistently. Such analytical persistence and acuity, however, remains a promise of work on Derrida that is, by and large, still caught between the poles of faithful exegesis and impatient criticism.

Since we can progress toward critical yet faithful discussion only by way of the former route, Thomson's book is a welcome event. I would recommend it to those seeking an introduction to Derrida on politics as well as to the adept who stand to benefit from its many interpretations and its cross-fertilizing illuminations.