Deep Refrains: Music, Philosophy, and the Ineffable

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Michael Gallope, Deep Refrains: Music, Philosophy, and the Ineffable, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 337pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226483559.

Reviewed by James O. Young, University of Victoria


I enthusiastically welcomed the opportunity to review this book. I recently agreed to take on the task of writing a 200,000-word history of philosophy of music and the authors discussed in Gallope's volume (Ernst Bloch, Theodore Adorno, Vladimir Jankélévitch, Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari) are among those that I need to bone up on for this history. (I am not a complete idiot: I persuaded one of my colleagues to be the co-author of this herculean undertaking.) Unfortunately, I have to say that this is not the book to read for those seeking an introduction to Continental philosophy of music. In fairness to Gallope, it is not intended as such. His goal is to identify and discuss a theme that runs through the first three of the figures he studies: a commitment to the view that the content of music is ineffable. Gallope traces this theme back to Schopenhauer. In his story, something changes with Deleuze and Guattari. Gallope holds that their philosophy of music represents a return to a sort of Pythagorean account of music. Rather than introducing readers to Continental philosophy of music, this book is probably only accessible to those already well grounded in this tradition. This book is turgid, arcane, prolix, prone to gnomic utterance, liable to digression and jargon-ridden. (I will quote enough passages for the reader to make an informed judgement about whether this is a fair appraisal.) This said, I believe that there is, hidden within this book, a good journal article on ineffability in Continental philosophy of music, but only a patient reader will be able to excavate it.

Gallope begins by tracing the themes addressed back to ancient and medieval writers. For example, he describes an eleventh-century Islamic writer as speaking "plainly of music's ineffability" when this unnamed philosopher writes that, "Music has a quality that speech cannot render, and words cannot express" (4). This Islamic writer has an ineffability thesis, but it is not clear which of two ineffability theses it is. The first sort of ineffability thesis says that music can have content (perhaps even philosophical significance) but that this content cannot be expressed in words. Advocates of a second sort of ineffability thesis hold that musical works do not have content, effable or ineffable, but they can be beautiful. According to this second thesis, one cannot capture in words what this musical beauty is: what it is for a work of music to be beautiful cannot be expressed. (This second thesis is defended by Hanslick and, among analytic philosophers, by Peter Kivy and Nick Zangwill.) Unfortunately, it is unclear which of these theses is adopted by the eleventh-century writer. Even more unfortunately, these two theses are distinguished nowhere in this book.

Gallope's story begins in earnest with Schopenhauer. Schopenhauer had inherited the old idea that the fine arts (poetry, painting, music, sculpture and dance) are imitative arts. This idea can be traced to Plato and Aristotle and was held in the eighteenth century by many writers, including Jean-Baptiste Du Bos, Charles Batteux and Rousseau. Schopenhauer's innovation was to distinguish music from the other fine arts. His distinction is bound up with his distinctive metaphysics. According to this metaphysics, the world has two aspects: representations and Will, which is the non-rational, aimless force at the heart of human instincts and, indeed, all of existence. Representations are a kind of manifestation of Will. Poetry, painting, sculpture and dance imitate the world of representations. According to Schopenhauer, music is, in contrast, "a copy of the will itself." The world of representations or phenomena are pale reflections of Platonic forms; the Will is the essence of reality. In music we find not expressions or imitations of individual emotions but rather expressions of "joy, pain, sorrow, horror, gaiety, merriment, peace of mind themselves" (Schopenhauer, World as Will and Representation (1844)). We understand these perfectly, Schopenhauer tells us, when we listen to music. Schopenhauer does not exactly say that what is expressed in music is ineffable. Rather, he states that music is a language of its own. Presumably natural languages cannot capture what the language of music can express.

Schopenhauer's account of the expressiveness of music cannot be separated from his metaphysics. Nevertheless, Gallope proposes, something of his view remains in Bloch, Adorno and Jankélévitch. He states his thesis in these terms: "for Bloch, Adorno, Jankélévitch, and Deleuze and Guattari, music requires form amid the material force of its gestures, yet these forms do not mean anything in particular . . . This leads to what I will call the paradox of the ineffable: music appears as a sensual immediacy at the same time that it always remains mediated by forms and techniques" (10). The claim that musical forms do not mean anything in particular is, of course, quite different from Schopenhauer's claim that we perfectly understand what is expressed in music. I am also not quite sure what the paradox is here. We have a sensual (aesthetic, even) experience of music. Musical works also have a form and are produced by compositional techniques, such as tonal harmony. I do not see any tension between the fact that we have a sensual experience of music and the fact that musical works have form and are produced by technique.

In the case of Bloch, Gallope finds that "music's Romantic exceptionalism is made unique by virtue of its dialectical confrontation between two contradictory halves: formalism and materiality, rationalization and singular exemplarity, speculative autonomy and embodied immanence" (68). Bloch's particular concern was utopia, and music somehow gives us insight into it:

The universality of utopia is something that cannot be simply presented, represented, or even indicated; it must be obscurely interpreted through the abstract and translucent tone of the fugato [in Beethoven's Marcia funebre]. Music's ineffability is a perplexing impetus to utopian insight (102).

A little later, on the same page, Gallope notes that

formal interpretations of a repertory or technique are in perpetual contradiction with a practical and social meaning. That fact that this contradiction is never reconciled in language -- only in an energetic fabric of musical tones -- is what gives music its perplexing and ineffable musical specificity (102).

I have several questions concerning what Gallope says about Bloch. Gallope's general thesis, quoted above, says that musical forms "do not mean anything in particular." In his discussion of Bloch, in contrast, we find reference to "specificity," albeit an ineffable specificity. Readers are left wondering about what Bloch believes: does music mean nothing in particular, or does it have a specific but ineffable meaning? If music has no specific meaning, it is hard to see how it can somehow be about utopia. So, let us assume that Bloch's considered view is that music has a specific meaning. Gallope's general thesis then needs to be revised. Moreover, we need some account of how we know that music specifically means something about utopia. The need for this account is particularly pressing since this is not intuitively obvious: most writers on music (excluding formalists) from antiquity to the present day (including Schopenhauer) have thought that music has something to do with emotion. Unfortunately, this account does not emerge in the course of Gallope's presentation of Bloch's views. This is, perhaps, not Gallope's fault. If the content of music is ineffable, then it is unreasonable to expect an account of how music is about utopia. However, in view of the broad consensus that music is somehow about emotion, I still wonder why Bloch thinks that it expresses something about utopia. I would have liked some insight into this matter.

I have some similar questions about Gallope's presentation of Adorno's philosophy of music. Gallope writes that Bloch and Adorno "shared a conviction that music, above all the arts, had an exceptional way of allowing one to think, or glimpse, or even reveal utopia" (110). Assume that this is the correct interpretation of Adorno. Gallope does not succeed in motivating this way of thinking about music when discussing Adorno any more than he does when discussing Bloch. Even as an interpretation of Adorno, Gallope's view is controversial. Gallope acknowledges (168) that some critics take Adorno for a formalist. According to formalism, of course, music has no content, ineffable or otherwise. I would have liked to have seen a case against the formalist interpretation of Adorno's philosophy of music.

Jankélévitch can be a notoriously difficult writer to interpret. In Gallope's view:

Jankélévitch might be best understood as an effort to keep philosophizing incessantly about exactly what might be understood about musical experience that lies beyond the orders of propositional and factual control . . . he cultivated a set of novel speculative practices that demonstrated how our language might ethically practice just the right kind of dialectical fidelity to music's ontological inconsistency -- its resistance to language altogether. (166)

I take this to mean that we cannot precisely capture, in propositional terms, what music is about. This point emerges, perhaps, more clearly when Jankélévitch is quoted as saying that, "Music does not 'explain' word by word, nor does it signify point by point; rather it suggests in rough terms, not being made for line-by-line translation or for the reception of indiscreet intimacies, but rather for atmospheres, spiritual evocations" (187). Here Jankélévitch sounds like many other writers in the history of philosophy of music. I disagree with Gallope's suggestion that this and similar passages commit Jankélévitch to the view that music is inexpressive and unemotional. Jankélévitch seems to be saying (perfectly sensibly, in my view) that the affects expressed in music cannot be perfectly captured in ordinary language.

According to Gallope, Deleuze and Guattari break more radically with Schopenhauer than did Bloch, Adorno and Jankélévitch. These writers "place great emphasis on the paradoxical structure of Schopenhauer's immediate copy. In contrast, by tightly integrating the spheres of the Dionysian and the Apollonian into a metaphysics of rhythm, Deleuze and Guattari displace the paradox of the ineffable to a more generalized question of cosmic structure" (220). Gallope interprets Deleuze and Guattari as adopting the ancient Pythagorean belief that the structure of music is also the structure of the cosmos: "music, of a common structure and substance with life itself, is metaphysically thought of as extending the syncopated counterpoint of the cosmos" (228). This may be the correct interpretation of Deleuze and Guattari, but if so I would have liked to have seen some critical assessment of their position, which, on the face of it, is quite tendentious.

The references in this book are uncommonly sloppy. When I found the philosophies of music of Bloch, Adorno and the others difficult to understand in Gallope's accounts of them, I decided to go back to the originals. It was then that I found that some references in the endnotes were incomplete: titles of essays were sometimes provided without the names of the volumes in which the essays appeared. Tracking essays down was more difficult when slightly wrong titles were provided. For example, Adorno's 'Music, Language, and Composition' does not immediately show up when the incorrect title, 'Music, Language, Composition,' (127) is used as a search term.

When Gallope strays into territory more familiar in the English-speaking world, his observations do not inspire confidence. Julian Dodd is said to have defended formalism in Works of Music (2007) when the book is actually a defence of a Platonist ontology of musical works. I also think that Roger Scruton would be surprised to find himself characterized as a formalist. Moreover, so far as I know, Scruton does not defend Platonism, or any other ontology of musical works.

For all of my criticisms, tracing the similarities and differences between Schopenhauer and subsequent contributors to Continental philosophy of music is an interesting project. This book can be recommended to those who are interested in this project and who are willing to struggle with a recondite style.