Deeper Than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art

Placeholder book cover

Jenefer Robinson, Deeper Than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art, Oxford University Press, 2005, 515pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199204268.

Reviewed by James Harold , Mount Holyoke College


 Dear Readers:

After a bit more than five years of publication, this is NDPR's 1000th review.  We'd like to take the occasion to thank everyone--our editorial board, our editorial assistants, our reviewers, and especially you our readers--for making the journal such a success. 

 Gary Gutting

Anastasia Friel Gutting 


Jenefer Robinson's Deeper Than Reason: Emotion and Its Role in Literature, Music, and Art is a remarkable book, with a wide scope and a clear, compelling main thesis.  In this book, Robinson convincingly shows how the expression and experience of emotion play a central role in the appreciation and creation of artworks.  Throughout the book, Robinson makes use of detailed examples of particular artworks, including Wharton's The Reef, and Brahms' "Immer leiser," which she examines with care and diligence.  The book has four sections.  The first section sets out Robinson's anti-judgmentalist theory of emotion, carefully drawing on empirical work for support, and critiquing alternative views.  The other three sections each build on this work, applying her theory to philosophical problems in literature, expression, and music, respectively.  Each part after the first is (more or less) independent of the others, so a reader whose primary interest is in musical emotion, for example, could skip from Part I straight to Part IV.  Helpfully, each section begins with a brief, clear introduction that summarizes the arguments to follow.

On Robinson's view, emotion has two key components: an "affective appraisal" and a corresponding physiological arousal.  A third component, a cognitive appraisal, normally follows.  The first of these is the most distinctive and the most important.  An affective appraisal is an evaluative process that takes places automatically and non-consciously.  It consists mostly in the rapid focusing of one's attention, especially one's perceptual attention, on relevant features of one's immediate environment.  An affective appraisal is much like a cognitive evaluation -- e.g., "That's scary" -- but the appraisal happens much too quickly to be counted as a thought or belief.  These appraisals are valenced and intentional, but they are not part of higher cognition.

In this way, Robinson's view, while clearly a non-cognitivist account, attempts to capture some of the strengths of cognitivist (or judgmentalist) theories of emotion.  The cognitivists are right to think that having an emotion necessarily involves taking an evaluative stance; they are wrong to think that this evaluative stance is a cognitive one.  Robinson's arguments for this view are compelling.  Her survey of emotion research is both broad and deep, and her accounting of the empirical literature is quite careful.  However, one might perhaps worry that too much of the research she relies on is based on a limited range of negative emotions, especially fear; Robinson might be a bit too quick to generalize those findings and to assume that all other emotions work in the same way.

Robinson goes on to emphasize the fluid nature of emotions: cognitive appraisals and further experiences "feed back" into one's emotional state.  Emotions are not states, but processes.  It is clearly an advantage of Robinson's theory that it begins with a model suited to the most basic emotional responses (e.g., a startle response to a loud noise) and ends by building on the model so that it can accommodate the most complex, highly cognitive, culturally sensitive emotions.  Robinson's view will strike some readers as similar to Jesse Prinz's; his book Gut Reactions was published slightly before Robinson's.  Working independently, Prinz and Robinson made use of some of the same psychological and neurological research.

The second part of the book applies this theory of emotion to literature.  Robinson surveys some of the chief philosophical puzzles concerning literature and attempts to show how her model can solve (or dissolve) those difficulties.  Her primary goal in this section is to show both that literature requires that we use our emotions in order to understand it, and that literature educates and improves our emotions as well as our ability to cope with them.  Along the way, she also offers compelling solutions to some traditional topics that have been much written about, such as the so-called "paradox of fiction," according to which it would be irrational for a reader to feel anything towards a fictional character.  Robinson disposes of this problem quickly and convincingly, noting that non-cognitive appraisals are made independently of and prior to any judgments about whether the character is "real".

The third section of the book is different than the second and the fourth in that Robinson is not here applying her theory of emotion to a particular art form, such as literature or music, but to the role of emotion in the creation of art.  The main argument of the third part is a defense and modification of Collingwood's theory of artistic expression.  Part of her accomplishment here is to present a more plausible interpretation of Collingwood than most philosophers are familiar with and then to defend a modest version of his claim that works of art can express the artist's emotion.  This section takes the claims of the previous section further: not only can art educate our emotions, the emotion in question can be, and sometimes is, "articulated and elucidated" by the artist.  Robinson supports her arguments with examples from a wide variety of arts: sculpture, painting, dance, and more.

The final section of the book takes up some of the most contentious topics in philosophy of art: the role of emotion in music.  There are three main topics addressed here: what it means to say that music "expresses" emotion, the role of emotion in understanding and appreciating music, and how music produces emotion in the listener.  In each case, Robinson takes on the dominant theories in the field and uses her own theory of emotion (and emotional expression) to critique them.  Her treatment of these topics is comprehensive and ought to be required reading for anyone interested in philosophy of music.  Robinson makes good use of an extended example, and ends with an provocative emendation to her theory of emotion: the "jazzercise effect," in which one experiences the physiological aspect of an emotion without, or at least before, making the affective appraisal appropriate to it.  I'll return to this phenomenon below.

Any book as ambitious and wide-ranging as Robinson's is bound to fall short in at least a few respects.  So I'll turn briefly to some critical remarks.

Robinson's account of emotion purports to apply uniformly to emotions in response to art and to emotions in response to real life events.  Robinson's account of emotion is based on extensive psychological and neurological studies of emotions like fear, where the stimulus for the emotion is a visual or auditory event, such as a loud, sudden sound (startle) or a threatening shape and motion (fear).  Robinson then goes on to extend this account of emotion to processes that are initiated not by a perceptual experience but by a thought or belief.  However, can a belief be processed by lower cognitive functions without the involvement of the complex information processing characteristic of higher brain functions?  It is one thing to claim that sounds and visual percepts can be parsed quickly through the amygdala to produce a non-cognitive appraisal and corresponding physiological response, and another thing to claim that beliefs can be processed in the same way. 

Robinson shows that in many cases readers experience physiological changes in response to reading that correlate appropriately with the emotions that they report themselves to have.  But she does not show that these changes are produced by automatic affective appraisals; so we cannot rule out the possibility that these physiological changes are produced, not by an affective appraisal, but rather by a cognitive appraisal, or by some other means.  Given that the relevant stimuli when reading works of fiction require conceptual analysis and linguistic understanding before they can serve to prompt an emotional response, there is some reason to think that the appraisals generated by works of literature may be rather different than those involved in, for example, a startle response.

Here is another difference between emotions in response to art and real life emotions: emotion, according to Robinson, focuses our attention on "things in the environment significant to me or mine," and it "gets my body ready for appropriate action" (59).  The physiological changes produced in an emotion serve the evolutionary function of directing our attention in appropriate ways, such as reorienting one's body to get visual information about the stimulus, as Robinson argues happens in startle responses.  Robinson claims that the same happens when reading literature:

The physiological response helps to focus attention on whatever it is that is affectively appraised (whether this be real or imaginary, an object of thought or an object of perception), as well as to alert others and perhaps oneself to the state one is in; it may also help prepare the person or organism for action. (157)

But in reading literature, the physiological changes cannot be related to the change of focus in this way.  The relevant "environment" for the reader of Anna Karenina is not the physical space around the reader's body but rather the thoughts represented by words printed on the page in front of the reader's eyes.  If anything, it seems that a strong physiological change produced by an emotion would be likely to direct the reader's attention to the environment outside the novel.  A physical readiness to run does not facilitate attentive reading.  Insofar as our emotional response to literature does seem to direct our attention back into the work of literature, it seems more plausible to suppose that the mechanisms responsible are cognitive, not purely affective.  Affective appraisals and corresponding physiological changes tend to bring us out of the imagination and into our own physical environment.

Another difference between emotions as they are generally experienced in everyday life and emotions in response to art is identified by Robinson herself.  She says that in responding to literature, "maybe we can form the point of view appropriate to a particular emotional state without any physiological changes" (139).  This might be because I make the appropriate judgment without experiencing a genuine emotion.  If we form a cognitive judgment that appropriately correlates with an affective appraisal that would normally form the core of an emotion, and yet we do not have the corresponding physiological response, then Robinson concludes that our emotion is not "bona fide" (95).  This possibility, together with Robinson's account of the "jazzercise effect" in the final part of the book, complicates her theory of emotion.  Consider the following chart:

                                    Types of Emotional or Pseudo-Emotional Processes

Affective appraisal of stimulus (e.g., "THREAT!"), as the product of sub-cortical brain processes




Physiological response (e.g., increased heart rate), caused (directly or indirectly) by the stimulus


Cognitive judgment (e.g., "Snakes are dangerous"), as the product of inferential reasoning or similar cognitive process



Bona fide emotion?






According to Robinson, the first two columns are unproblematic: if a stimulus produces an affective appraisal, the appraisal will produce physiological changes whether or not it is accompanied by a cognitive appraisal.  The third column represents the possibility that Robinson suggests may not be actual: the formation of a cognitive judgment appropriate to a particular emotion without the corresponding affective appraisal or physiological response.  If such cases do exist, however, she claims that they are not cases of bona fide emotions.  The fourth column, however, is one that she does not consider.  Suppose that in reading The Reef I form a cognitive judgment about Darrow, and that this judgment in turn produces physiological changes in me as I read, but that I do not make an affective appraisal of Darrow.  Is this even possible, according to Robinson?  If it were possible, would it be an emotion?

Robinson does concede that the physiological changes that are typically produced by affective appraisals are independent of them and can be produced without them.  This is shown in the final column, which represents what Robinson calls "the jazzercise effect."  These are physiological changes produced directly by stimuli.  These changes do not themselves constitute emotions "unless and until" the subject makes affective appraisals that feed back into those physiological changes.  Jazzercise effects are produced, she thinks, through a kind of contagion, not only occurring outside of conscious awareness but also outside of the automatic affective mechanisms that produce bona fide emotions.

The jazzercise effect helps to make clear the logical relationships that Robinson thinks hold between affective appraisals and corresponding physiological changes.  Early in the book I believed that her view was that one has an affective appraisal if and only if one has the corresponding physiological changes.  Her view, however, is that if one has an affective appraisal of a given characteristic emotion type, then one will (ceteris paribus) have the physiological changes typical of that type.  But it is not the case that if one has the physiological changes typical of a certain emotion type, then one must have had an affective appraisal of that type.  Affective appraisals are (normally) sufficient but not necessary for the physiological changes with which they are strongly associated.

Why, then, couldn't the physiological changes characteristic of a given emotion come about through an alternative route, such as the actions of higher cognitive functions?  When Robinson argues that readers of fiction do experience emotions, she does so by offering evidence that their bodies undergo physiological changes typical of emotion.  But she does not show that the readers make affective appraisals.  Given the concerns I raised earlier about thoughts serving as appropriate raw material for affective appraisals, why not consider the possibility that the reader of fiction produces cognitive judgments (e.g., "It is sad that Anna had to leave without giving her toys to Seryozha"), and then a slowed heart rate, changes in skin temperature, etc., without forming the affective appraisals that Robinson thinks are the sine qua non of emotion?

However, these concerns do not in any way diminish Robinson's accomplishment in this book.  Robinson says in her epilogue that one of her ambitions in the book has been to marry the "Two Cultures," the scientific and the humanistic.  And indeed her book succeeds marvelously in this respect.  Though there has been increasing attention to scientific research by philosophers in recent years, and some classic works of philosophy of art involve careful analyses of particular works of art in some detail, rarely (if ever) have these two approaches to philosophy been combined so carefully and so seamlessly.  I hope that Robinson's book will encourage other philosophers to make use of both the humanistic and scientific resources essential to the serious philosophical study of art and emotion.