Defeasibility in Philosophy: Knowledge, Agency, Responsibility, and the Law

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Claudia Blöser, Mikael Janvid, Hannes Ole Matthiessen, and Marcus Willaschek (eds.), Defeasibility in Philosophy: Knowledge, Agency, Responsibility, and the Law, Rodopi, 2013, 257pp., $78.40 (pbk), ISBN 9789042037618.

Reviewed by Matthew Lister, Law Clerk, U.S. Court of Appeals for the 3rd Circuit


This volume is based on papers presented at a conference on defeasibility in ethics, epistemology, law, and logic that took place at the Goethe University in Frankfurt in 2010. The subtitle (“Knowledge, Agency, Responsibility, and the Law”) better reflects the content than does the title of the original conference. None of the papers focuses directly or primarily on defeasible reasoning in logic, though a few touch on this indirectly. Nor are the papers evenly split among the topics. Six are primarily about epistemology, four about responsibility, and one each focuses on agency and the law. This might make us wonder whether it really makes sense to publish these papers together.

This worry is of some concern here, as it was not obvious to me that anyone who did not have a specific interest in defeasibility as such was likely to find it worthwhile to read the whole volume, but three factors at least mitigate this worry. First, for anyone who is interested in defeasibility as such it is quite useful to see how the idea functions in various domains. This can throw light not just on these fields, but also on the nature of defeasibility. I will return to this point below. Secondly, interesting light can often be thrown on the nature of one area of philosophy by seeing how the same or similar concepts function in other areas. So, if defeasibility plays a different role or functions in a different way in epistemology and action theory, this can tell us something not only about defeasibility, but also about each of the areas of inquiry. Finally, nearly all of the papers engage in interesting sub-disciplinary boundary-crossing, using, for example, ideas from the law and legal study to throw light on epistemology, or from action theory to investigate issues in epistemology, in a way that is both potentially useful for those working in these areas and interesting in its own right. The volume therefore avoids the fate of many conference proceedings of deserving the subtitle, "A hodge-podge of papers on various topics".

The editors provide a short and very helpful introduction, where the basic structure of defeasible reasoning is spelled out and some different approaches and focuses noted. Each essay is itself preceded by a short summary. These are generally quite useful and should let the more selective reader know which topics to focus on. The volume ends with an extensive thematic bibliography, listing works on defeasible reasoning in many areas of philosophy, in English and other (western) languages, including several topics not covered in the volume itself. Rather than specifically address each of the essays I will set out some of the most interesting and important aspects of the idea of defeasibility, and show how these are addressed in, or raise problems for, the various chapters.

The idea of defeasibility gained prominence in philosophy through the work of H. L. A. Hart.[1] Hart took the idea of defeasibility from property law and attempted to show how it could have broader usage. Many of the old forms found in property law where the notion of defeasibility arose are now, much to the joy of law students, of mostly historical interest. But, the idea can still be easily illustrated. Consider a typical type of estate, from late medieval England, a form called a maritagium: "when a man has received lands with his wife in marriage, they shall revert to the donor after the death of the wife unless issue has been born alive; it is not necessary that it should have survived."[2] Such a rule fits the paradigmatic scheme of defeasible concepts set out by the editors, "If A, then B, unless C". (2)[3] Defeasibility also played a part in the slow development of contract law. But, Hart thought that he had noted a much more general element of defeasibility in modern contract law, and that this in turn could tell us something important about moral responsibility.

Hart held that "contract" was a "defeasible concept". This is to say that, while there are typical necessary factors for a contact to exist, validity of the contract can be undermined by any number of contingencies. This can be formulated as a scheme: if X satisfies conditions A1-An , then X is F, unless some defeating conditions Bor Bor B3 or . . . obtains. (2) It is important for Hart's account, and for some of the questions that follow, that the "conditions" for X to be F be finite and usually fairly easily surveyable. This allows us to treat X being F in "normal conditions" as a default. Additionally, it is important that the defeating conditions are not just multiple, but open-ended. In the paradigm case, we cannot give a full list of the defeating conditions -- there are always others possible, and the list is open-ended. The question of possible causes of this open-endedness is an issue I will return to below.

Hart held that the idea of defeasibility, as drawn from the law, could throw significant light on our ideas of moral responsibility and related notions in action theory. Hart's view involved treating notions such as "voluntary" not as descriptions of behavior, arrived at via empirical investigation, but as ascriptive -- when we call an act voluntary, we are ascribing responsibility to the actor. Hart then held that terms like "voluntary" were defeasible concepts in the way noted above -- they have typical conditions of applicability, but are susceptible to an open-ended list of defeating conditions. Hart's ascriptivism was famously attacked by Geach,[4] who has been widely taken to have shown that Hart's ascriptive sentences could be easily re-cast as traditional truth-functionally complex descriptive sentences. Hart seems to have been at least largely persuaded by Geach's attack, but Michael Williams, in his important contribution, argues that Geach's attack can be driven back, and that a version of ascriptivism can be saved. Williams is particularly interested in showing that, when we take the steps he suggests, epistemic justification can be shown to be a normative and defeasible concept in Hart's sense.

Williams suggest that the way to salvage ascriptivism, and so one important aspect of seeing certain concepts as defeasible, is to move from Hart's dichotomy of ascriptive/descriptive to a continuum account. To do this, we adopt a use-theoretic approach to the constitution of meaning. When we do this, we can see that there are ascriptive uses of certain sentences, as opposed to ascriptive concepts as such. This approach to meaning is not without controversy, but if it allows us to make sense of more of our practices than rivals, this will be a strong point in its favor. Williams goes on to argue that epistemological vocabulary is best understood in deontological terms -- knowledge and justification imply authority, and this in turn involves the idea of responsibility in three senses: accountability, due diligence, and liability. These, he argues, are used ascriptively, not descriptively, and are defeasible concepts in Hart's sense. This use-theoretic approach to defeasibility and ascriptivism is not directly focused on by most of the other papers, though it is often in the background, and something like it will be necessary if many of the accounts in the volume are to avoid Geach's challenge. This is likely to be a controversial point, but I will put it aside.

The next question I want to turn to is one about the nature of defeasibility. Most broadly put, we can understand this as a question about the depth of defeasibility. This in turn raises important questions about what it means to say that a concept is defeasible, and why defeasible concepts have the structure that they do. If we return to Hart, we can see how this problem may be set up. Recall that Hart took the idea of defeasibility from the law, and then applied it to moral responsibility, though he used the idea of a contract to illustrate his analysis. Hart held that defeasible concepts have an essentially open-ended aspect to them. They defy analysis in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. That is, it is not possible to positively specify the conditions necessary to apply the term, and the list of possible defeaters is also open-ended.

Interestingly, however, this does not seem to accurately describe the sort of instances from the history of the common law where the idea of defeasibility originated. Consider again our example of a defeasible estate, the maritagium. It does not involve the sort of open-endedness that Hart ascribed to defeasible concepts. This leads to the question of how fundamental this sort of open-endedness is to the very idea of defeasibility. The question is in the background of several of the papers, but comes up most explicitly in the exchange between Claudia Blöser and R. Jay Wallace on the nature of responsibility.

Blöser sees herself as working in the tradition of Hart, but varies from him in several important ways. First, rather than following the full Hart scheme, she sees responsibility as having a simpler "default and challenge" structure. This structure, followed by many in the volume, holds that we make certain attributions "by default", at least under normal circumstances, but that the default can be over-come by certain challenges. For a default to apply, certain minimal conditions must be met. When the default conditions fail to apply, we have a situation similar to what Hart called a "failure of joinder of issue." These differ from "challenges", which are taken to be, strictly speaking, compatible with the fulfillment of the default conditions. This distinction throws light on two different aspects of responsibility: accountability, which lines up with the default conditions, and "praise-or-blameworthiness", which lines up with the challenges. Blöser holds that our normal standard for accountability is fairly easily set out: one must be an adult. If one is an adult, the default is to hold her responsible. But, the default conditions can be overcome in the case of an exemption: if the person in question is, for example, mentally ill. Accountability is, in turn, a necessary condition for "praise-or-blameworthiness". If someone meets the default conditions for responsibility, holding her responsible for her actions is appropriate unless some challenge condition holds. The challenge conditions are the typical excuses -- mistake, inadvertence, coercion, and so on. (An odd feature of Blöser's account here is its neglect of the way that responsibility is highly context sensitive, especially with regard to excuses. In her account responsibility is treated in a largely categorical fashion, but of course it is usually a matter of degree, with several valiances. So, a mistake may or may not excuse, depending on how reasonable it was, even if it's an "honest" mistake, and if I inadvertently cause the destruction of your car, I might not be criminally responsible, but may still be liable for damages in tort. There is very little recognition of this in the paper, so it is hard to know if Blöser's account can be squared with it. I worry that it would quickly become very complicated, compromising some of the charm of the seemingly very simple structure, but I will put this aside.)

Blöser's discussion of how to understand the default-and-challenge structure of responsibility leads us back to the question of the nature of defeasibility. Unfortunately, she gives an answer that does not seem to me to be completely internally coherent. She first notes that challenges seem to be constituted by practices, and that this seems to lead to a sort of relativism. In the past, being (taken to be) possessed by the Devil could be an exempting condition, while it (typically) is not seen as such now. If responsibility is ascriptive "all the way down", then it will rest on our practices of holding responsible. These practices of holding responsible can change over time, sometimes for good reason, but on this account we will not find the "true nature" of responsibility apart from our practices of holding responsible.

But Blöser considers another approach, one that suggests that ascriptivism about responsibility might be, at most, a second-best practice, and that we might learn when someone is "really" responsible in a way that does not just depend on our practices. Blöser suggest that further work on the brain, for example, might lead to this, opening up a partial gap between the ascription of responsibility and "really" being responsible. It should be easy to see how this moves away from Hart in an important way. If there is a deep structure or real nature to responsibility, then it can be set out in positive terms, at least in principle, in a way that Hart denied. This would make defeasibility shallow, at least in cases where a similar situation obtained. As Wallace points out, this makes Blöser's account fundamentally different from Hart's. We are here left with difficult questions that are not directly addressed in most of the papers. These include not only the immediate question of whether Blöser or Hart has the better account of responsibility, but also whether there is a general answer to the nature of ascriptive claims and defeasible concepts -- are they all "shallow" in the sense suggested by Blöser's account of responsibility, with true natures behind them, or are some of them, even if not all, deep in the way that Hart thought? It is a weakness of the volume that, though defeasibility is looked at in many areas, there is no sustained investigation into the question of the nature of defeasibility in general or whether it is even one thing at all. If different sorts of defeasibility apply in different areas, we will have to worry that taking advances made in, say, action theory and applying them to epistemology might lead to confusion rather than enlightenment. Unfortunately, this potential problem is not given significant attention in any of the papers. It seems to me to be an area ripe for further study.

A related under-addressed issue is why defeasible concepts should have the structure or nature that they do. One answer would be that this is essentially an epistemic fact about our relationship to the concepts. We treat them as defeasible concepts because we do not know, or fully know, the real nature of the thing picked out by the term. This approach, which seems inherent in Blöser's account, has some similarity with epistemicism as an approach to vagueness. On this account, we assume there is a real nature picked out, or potentially picked out, by defeasible concepts, but we do not know what it is. In some cases it might be fundamentally unknowable, but in others we might make progress and even learn the true nature. Blöser's discussion of how learning more about the brain might change our conception of responsibility is an example of this line of thought. But, we might also think that defeasible concepts, or at least some of them, are indeterminate in a deeper way. One possibility here, hinted at but not developed in the exchange between Wallace and Blöser, and lurking in the background of several papers, would be that defeasible concepts irreducibly depend on our practices, and insofar as our practices are themselves open-ended and subject to change, so would be the relevant concepts.

A third option, explored by Fredrick Schauer,would be that defeasibility is the result of the "open texture" of language, or perhaps of a particular field, such as the law. In a formalization of the idea of open texture by Stewart Shapiro, quoted by Schauer, we are told that "[the concept or term] P exhibits open texture if there are possible objects p such that nothing in the established use of P, or the non-linguistic facts, determine that P holds of p or that P fails to hold of p. In effect, Pp is left open by the use of language to date." (199) Friedrich Waismann, who introduced the idea of the open texture of language to analytic philosophy, was primarily concerned with attacking positivist accounts of the meaning of empirical terms. Hart adopted this idea for his analysis of the function of rules in law, arguing that they, too, have an open texture, and that this helps explain the function of certain legal concepts and the behavior of judges.

How the idea of an open texture illuminates the idea of defeasibility turns out to be less clear than we might have hoped, and Schauer's paper is not as helpful on this as we might have hoped. Schauer suggests that it is Hart's view that "law's open texture produces the necessary defeasibility of legal rules." (197) But, though Hart talked about both defeasibility and open texture, he did not do so in the same place and never explicitly ties them together. "Defeasibility" does not appear at all in The Concept of Law, the text Schauer focuses on, and where "open texture" is most extensively discussed. And, "open texture" is not explicitly invoked by Hart to explain defeasibility in the paper where he introduced the term. It is perhaps unsurprising, then, that Schauer's paper is not primarily focused on the nature of defeasibility, and he does not try to explain how it might be related to open texture, beyond suggesting that this must be Hart's view. Schauer's main target is the idea that law might have an open texture beyond the fact that it is represented in language that is itself open-textured. Hart's texts here are not as clear as they might be, and I am left unsure if Hart thought there was necessarily a special open texture in law, though Schauer does do a plausible job of showing that, whether Hart was committed to this idea or not, it is at least not obvious that legal rules necessarily have a special sort of open texture of their own.

But might open texture (of language) explain the defeasibility of certain concepts? Perhaps, but if this is so, it may open up problems for the idea that defeasibility is a unified field of inquiry. Consider the formalization of open texture due to Shapiro noted before. This might well explain the defeasible nature of certain concepts or terms. If "contract" was a term with an open texture in Shapiro's sense, this might explain why the set of possible defeaters of some contract is open-ended and indeterminate. But open texture is not needed to explain defeasible concepts that are not necessarily open-ended (such as the idea of a defeasible estate in property law), and the idea sits uneasily with the epistemic notion of defeasibility, where real natures exist (findable or not) behind our concepts, as invoked by Blöser and others in the volume. This does not mean that open-texture is not related to defeasibility, but does suggest that different cases of defeasibility might not share any deep explanation. If that is so, then we likely need to be careful in adopting insights from one area of inquiry to another, just because defeasible concepts are used in both. The underlying explanation for defeasibility may turn out to be more important than the surface similarities. If this is so, then the seemingly fruitful borrowings between epistemology, action theory, legal philosophy, and so on, in the text might well be leading us down false paths. I am not sure of this, but think that the question deserves more attention than it receives here.

Let me finish with one final worry about the approach taken by many of the papers. At several points, "our communicative practices" (making factual assertions (117), how people will respond to changing epistemic stakes (68), and ways that "we use the concept of responsibility in our practice" (159)) are invoked. But, in these and similar cases, I found myself quite unsure of whether the descriptions of "our practices" were correct, and no evidence was adduced to reduce this worry beyond the intuition and insight of the various authors. I do not think this sort of appeal to intuition or informal observation is completely or necessarily inappropriate, nor do I think that philosophers should turn themselves into amateur social psychologists. But the need for these claims to be backed up by evidence beyond intuition and casual observation -- by actual studies of epistemic and moral practice -- should be plain. Such research might go a long way towards solving several of the controversies in the book.

Only readers interested in defeasibility as such are likely to want to read this book straight through. But, the individual essays are nearly all interesting, and are worth consulting for those interested in defeasibility in the particular subject areas, or in how one area of philosophy may have light thrown on it by work in another area.

[1] Hart, H. (1948-49) "The Ascription of Responsibilities and Rights". Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series 49: 171-94.

[2] Plucknett, T. (1936) A Concise History of the Common Law, 2nd ed. Rochester: The Lawyers Co-Operative Publishing Co.

[3] Parenthetical citations are to the volume under review.

[4] Geach, P. (1960) "Ascriptivism". The Philosophical Review 69, 221-25.