Defending Associative Duties

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Jonathan Seglow, Defending Associative Duties, Routledge, 2013, 215pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415813105.

Reviewed by Henry S. Richardson, Georgetown University


This book sets out a general account of relationship-based duties. It then proceeds to develop instances of the account that apply to parents' duties to their children, to children's duties to their parents, and to duties owed to one another by friends, members of voluntary associations, and fellow citizens. Much inspired by work in this area by Samuel Scheffler, Jonathan Seglow sets out to answer, both in general and in relation to some of the tougher cases, two objections to associative duties that Scheffler articulated. The first is the "voluntarist objection." This objection has it that mere participation in a relationship cannot be the basis of any special obligation: only a voluntary undertaking can generate any duty that is above and beyond what is derivable from general duties applicable to all. The second is the "distributive objection." It notes that since being in a relationship in itself provides distinctive goods to the participants, it seems odd to hold that, on top of that, relationship participants have special moral claims on those they are in the relationship with. It might seem enough of a departure from morality's impartiality to permit participants in relationships to give certain kinds of special preference to one another. Why should morality go farther and require them to do so?

Seglow takes his theory to apply to relationships that are "enduring, substantive, mutually affirmed interactions between two or more people," that are not too "slender," and that are mediated by "intangible, nonfungible, shared goods which prompt normative attitudes" and serve the parties' interests (28), thus generating agent-relative reasons (31). According to his "relationship goods view," it is these "relationship goods" that ground associative duties, even absent any tincture of voluntary undertaking or reliance (30). If Seglow's theory is correct, the voluntarist objection is simply off base. Of course, by highlighting relationship goods, Seglow's answer to the voluntarist objection plays directly into the hands of the distributive objection. Seglow's main explicit response to the distributive objection is to sidestep its brunt by emphasizing that associative duties bear on the relationship-based goods distinctive to a given type of relationship, and not on goods as such. Thus, for instance, parents owe their children special love and attention, but not necessarily any large amount of money (44). Similarly, fellow citizens owe one another equal respect as ultimate lawmakers in their jurisdiction, not necessarily all of their tax dollars (151), which might be more justly sent elsewhere (170). This response mitigates the damage, but does not confront the skeptical force of the distributive objection, which asks why those who already benefit from being in a valuable relationship should gain the further advantage of special rights. Although Seglow does not much mention special, relationship-based (claim-) rights, I take it that this is what he is out to defend. He does explicitly say that "Associative duties are directed duties," owed by one person specifically to another (10). This raises the bar, compared, say, with the claim that relationships merely support moral reasons to act in certain ways.

The theory falls short, however, whether one takes the book's aim to be, as stated, the establishment of directed associative duties, or simply to be the articulation of certain moral reasons to act in certain ways towards those in whom one is in a relationship of the relevant kind. As developed -- with one specific exception I will note -- it is a non-starter. Seglow's general grounding of associative duties boils down to the following:

  1. Each type of relationship under consideration essentially involves, and is the sole context in which it is possible to realize, certain goods.
  2. These relationship goods, or some of them, are "moral goods" (e.g., 41, 173).
  3. These moral goods ground associative duties.

Seglow well, and in interesting detail, establishes claim (1). His argument is in trouble in two other places. First, claim (2) is insufficiently developed for it to do any real work. Seglow does not tell us what he means by "moral goods," unless one counts his glossing them as "good, in the sense of morally valuable" (95) and denying that they are necessarily constituents of well-being (157). Without any account of why the relationship goods Seglow discusses are to be classed as, in any sense, "moral goods," we lack any grounds even to hold that they give rise to moral reasons. Second, the conclusion at (3) is a non sequitur, even supposing that claim (2) had been adequately glossed and defended. These two problems combine in inferences such as the following: "If mutual concern is a relationship good constitutive of the good of friendship, then the preparedness to help which it involves is a genuine moral ought" (97). To be sure, some may intuitively judge there to be moral reasons involved in some of these relationships (in some, such as membership in voluntary association, this suggestion is less intuitively appealing). The question is what explains and vindicates these appearances.

It is hard to imagine how these faults in the argument could be repaired in a way that could save the relationship goods view. Consider, first, the weaknesses with claim (2). Suppose we assume that moral goods are simply goods distinctive to the "moral sphere" (whatever that is), as opposed to economic goods or entertainment goods. It does not follow from the fact that such moral goods are at stake in a relationship that the participants have any duty to promote or protect those goods. The inference might hold if "moral goods" are, by definition, goods that morally ought to be promoted. In that case, though, the core of the argument would have to have been to establish that relationship goods are moral goods, in this demanding and non-standard sense. There is no argument to this effect in the book.

Regarding the non sequitur embodied in taking step (3), it is plain that to draw conclusions about duties from premises about goods, some further premise is needed -- here, a prescriptive or duty-stating one suitably framed for the context of relationship-based duties. In that context, one will not get very far with Aquinas's first principle of natural law ("good is to be done and pursued and evil is to be avoided," S.T. I-II, Q. 94, a. 2), which stands at too high a level of abstraction for the purpose.[1] The assumption that relationship goods are to be promoted will not secure the desired duties, for it would seem to leave the agent completely free to cut her losses by dumping her current set of friends and taking up with new ones who will offer her more of these goods going forward. Seglow does assert that relationship goods are "nonfungible" (28) and are inflected by the history of each particular relationship; but he does not attempt to show that the agent-relative value of one friendship cannot rationally substitute for that of another friendship. I am sympathetic with Seglow's wish to avoid casting associative duties as derivative from more basic duties or principles; yet justifying associative duties in a way that invokes some moral principle or duty-stating principle does not necessarily capitulate to a reductive account of those associative duties, as he seems to fear.

Surprisingly, in one place, namely in his discussion of citizens' duties toward one another, which include the duty of fidelity to the democratically enacted law of their jurisdiction, Seglow steps outside his relationship goods view by supplying a premise that would complete the justification, albeit in a way that does veer toward the reductive: "democratic respect is realised only when citizens acknowledge and act from a principle of equal public standing, and rejection of that principle would be unreasonable" (145, emphasis added). An independent, underlying moral principle substantively tied to the defining goods of a relationship might indeed underwrite associative duties.

Remember, further, that Seglow understands the associative duties to be directed duties. He does not even seem to recognize how this makes his self-appointed task harder. He may have thought that the path to directed duties was blazed by Scheffler, and that he could simply follow it. Early on (16-17), he expounds Scheffler's account of associative duties. Because Scheffler is aiming to support directed duties, he makes a point of preparing the way for them. For instance, he describes the value of friendship as essentially involving each friend as seeing her- or himself as owing special duties to, and having special claims against, the other. He suggests that since there are valuable friendships, there are such special duties.[2] If this argument went through, it would provide a goods-based argument for directed duties; but Seglow does nothing to defend this view. Further, he drops this assertion about the moral beliefs of those in relationships from his argument. Even with this premise, Scheffler's argument stands in need of defense, for it is hard to see how the existence of valuable friendships, understood as he understands them, could establish the truth of the friends' beliefs about their duties and claims.

Because Seglow's field is political philosophy, because the chapters on citizenship and international justice are among the best-developed in the book, and because associative duties have been controversial as proposed grounds for political obligation, I return briefly to citizens' relationship-based obligations. In discussions of political obligation, A. John Simmons has incisively and persistently raised not only the voluntarist objection against associative and similar views, but also the particularity problem: the requirement that the obligations be shown aptly to run towards the lawgivers of the jurisdiction in question, and not to lawgivers more generally.[3] Seglow well defends his view against the challenge posed in the second of these conjuncts by grounding citizens' duties to one another as the lawmakers of a particular jurisdiction; however, this does not fully meet the challenge of the first conjunct, as Simmons has developed it. As Simmons notes, it is not enough that a given group of people democratically rules a piece of territory. For this to be an apt basis of moral duty, this group's just claim to rule this territory must be established -- hard to do in this world where governments, including the democratic ones, have mostly set themselves up on the basis of violent conquest or secession.

Although, for reasons noted, the relationship goods view of associative duties is not promising, Seglow's book could serve as a useful teaching tool in an upper-level or graduate course on associative or relationship-based duties. The general chapters at the outset, as well as the chapters on various specific relationships, contain vivid concrete examples and handy reviews of the recent literature on the topic at hand.

[1] Importing here the further principle, defended by some neo-Thomists, that one must not attack any instance of basic good would threaten to make breaking up -- which is already hard to do -- too hard to do. See, e.g., Alfonso Gómez-Lobo, Morality and the Human Goods (Georgetown University Press, 2002), 46-7.

[2] See Samuel Scheffler, "Morality and Reasonable Partiality," in his Equality and Tradition: Questions of Value in Moral and Political Theory (Oxford University Press, 2010), pp. 41-75.

[3] A. John Simmons, Justifications and Legitimacy: Essays on Rights and Obligations (Cambridge University Press, 2001).