Defending Biodiversity: Environmental Science and Ethics

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Jonathan A. Newman, Gary Varner, and Stefan Linquist, Defending Biodiversity: Environmental Science and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 441pp., $47.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521146203.

Reviewed by Alkistis Elliott-Graves, University of Helsinki


"Imagine that you are an environmentalist who passionately believes that it is wrong to drill for oil in the Arctic National Wildlife Refuge. How do you convince someone that a decision to drill is wrong?" This quote from the blurb accurately sums up the motivation, content and approach of Newman, Varner and Linquist's book. The authors, self-proclaimed environmentalists, go over the existing defences of biodiversity conservation with a critical fine-toothed comb, searching for the ones that can best withstand the critics' scrutiny. The book is an exemplar of accessible philosophical writing that can be applied to real-world problems by academics and non-academics alike.

If this book had been written twenty or thirty years earlier, it would have been an insightful academic discussion of how well-meaning arguments for conservation can be overturned by those with a different agenda. It could have been taught as a cautionary tale for students of environmental philosophy, environmental economics or law to take extreme care when formulating arguments for the conservation of biodiversity, because the implications of existing arguments could be used to undermine conservation efforts. For example, it could have shown that that assigning a non-intrinsic (e.g. monetary) value on 'nature' can backfire, if the calculations are designed so that the particular part of 'nature' in question is always less valuable than its rival. Nowadays, these types of claims are no longer merely cautionary speculations; we are living in the aftermath of many repeals and reversals of laws based on these arguments for biodiversity conservation. For example, the Trump administration has recently repealed a number of laws aimed at conserving particular species or pockets of biodiversity including restrictions on hunting predators, limits on fishing open seasons, restrictions on fishing catch rates and marine mammals caught unintentionally in nets and protection of migratory birds (H.J.Res.69; Popovich et al., 2018).

This state of affairs does not make the book any less timely or important. While Newman, Varner and Linquist do not contribute a new argument for conservation, they perform an invaluable service, that of collecting the existing arguments in one place and providing insightful explanations and critiques of each. Identifying the weaknesses of existing arguments is necessary for improving them and for ensuring that mistakes are not repeated in the future. In short, professional philosophers and scientists, students, and "anyone who engages in discussions about the value of biodiversity conservation" (back cover), should have access to this resource so as to teach or learn about the state-of-the-art in biodiversity conservation.

In what follows, I will summarise the book's contents and discuss what I see as its main attributes and shortcomings. I should note that, as the book does not provide novel arguments for biodiversity, I will not be critiquing particular defences or criticisms that are presented. To my knowledge, the authors have done an excellent job of accurately reproducing existing defences and critiques of biodiversity conservation. Instead, I will be focusing on how well they present each argument, how accessible their reproductions are, and the extent to which they have synthesised the existing information. The lack of novel arguments for biodiversity is not necessarily a problem, as finding a new defence is orthogonal to the book's main goal. However, providing entirely new arguments is only one way philosophers can contribute to a debate. An alternative is to collect the strongest parts of existing arguments and examine whether they can be synthesized into a novel argument. The structure of the book makes such a synthesis possible, but it does not materialise. This is the book's main shortcoming.

The book starts with an explanation of the term 'biodiversity', a short description of the ways in which it can be measured and an overview of what the authors call 'the environmentalist agenda' i.e. the most important (and not necessarily consistent) tenets of environmentalism. The rest is divided into two parts, each devoted to a different type of argument for the conservation of biodiversity. In Part I, the authors examine the anthropocentric instrumental value defences, i.e. those based on the idea that nature and biodiversity should be valued for some other purpose or end. In chapter 2, the authors examine the argument from Ecosystem Functioning and Stability, focusing on how the terms 'ecosystem functioning' and 'ecosystem stability' should be understood and examining the extent to which there is empirical support for the claims that conserving biodiversity increases ecosystem functioning. They conclude that the empirical evidence is inadequate to support general claims for conserving biodiversity, but can only be used successfully in specific cases. Chapter 3 examines the Precautionary Principle defence, the worry that the loss of biodiversity can have unknown negative consequences and should therefore be avoided, but concludes it is not suitable for policy, as some versions of the principle are unclear, while others are logically inconsistent. In chapter 4, the authors examine whether conserving biodiversity has agricultural and pharmaceutical benefits, and in chapter 5 they examine whether biodiversity can increase nature-based tourism. They conclude that both these defences can only be successfully used in a small subset of cases, but are not strong enough to provide a defence of conserving biodiversity in general.

Part II examines the arguments based on the idea that nature and biodiversity have intrinsic value. The authors start off with a methodological introduction to philosophical ethics (chapter 7), including intuitionism, reflective equilibrium and the role of thought experiments. They explain the context for using these tools and how they differ from the empirical support that was important in Part I. In chapter 8, they consider the argument that individual organisms are intrinsically valuable, focusing on utilitarian and deontological versions of sentientism. According to the authors, this is the strongest moral position in defence of biodiversity. However, they warn that it goes against some parts of the environmentalist agenda, such as culling invasive sentient species. In chapters 9 and 10 the authors consider two forms of ecoholism (the view that entire ecosystems are units that have intrinsic value): the extensionist approach to whole ecosystems, and Aldo Leopold's Land Ethic approach. They conclude that both approaches are indefensible, as ecosystems and species are not the sorts of things that can have intrinsic value, while the advice in Leopold's work is not an adequate guide for policy. In chapter 11, the authors consider the argument that biodiversity has aesthetic value and should therefore be conserved. They are largely sympathetic to the argument that natural beauty can be understood as intrinsically valuable, but warn that an aesthetic defence will not automatically apply to all ecosystems or species.

The last chapter of each part (6 and 12 respectively) is a concluding summary of the previous chapters in the section. In the final chapter (13), each author outlines his own personal insights regarding arguments for biodiversity conservation and provides some contextual background for his views. Here, the authors document the sometimes surprising evolution of their views on biodiversity conservation throughout their academic careers and since beginning the book project.

Perhaps the most important attribute of the book is that the authors deliver on their promise, i.e., to provide a critical review of the existing arguments for conserving biodiversity that is truly interdisciplinary and accessible not only to philosophers, but also to scientists, social scientists, maybe even policy-makers and the general public. Each chapter is structured in a similar way, starting with the basic definitions, so that everyone is on the same page, continuing on to a clear and concise presentation of the particular argument for biodiversity and ending with a discussion of its weaknesses. In Part I, wherever the weaknesses are empirical in nature, the authors do an excellent job of presenting the evidence in an accessible manner. They explain numbers, equations and diagrams in detail and make a point of identifying the take-home message from each example.

Moreover, Newman, Varner and Linquist are careful to point out when an argument's shortcoming is inevitable or unavoidable because of inherent difficulties of experimental design in complex systems. For example, when explaining the limitations of experimental design for the claim that biodiversity increases ecosystem functioning (chapter 2), they outline a typical experiment and explain its limitations. This was a grassland field experiment examining the relationship between species richness and biomass production, i.e. whether higher diversity in a plot of land yielded more plants after a certain period of time (1, 2 and 3 years). An important limitation was that the scientists in question did not explore every possibility of species combination in the experiment. However, the authors show that overcoming this limitation is practically impossible, because it would require more than 16,000 plots to construct a single replicate, whereas the scientists had a mere 56 at their disposal. Highlighting the difficulties of every-day scientific practice provides essential contextual information for the debate concerning biodiversity conservation, and helps to remind readers that answers in science do not come easily.

I was especially impressed by section 2.5. At first glance it is a summary of the empirical evidence for the ecosystem functioning defence, yet this summary is actually an examination of an existing meta-analysis. The choice of meta-analysis (Cardinale et al. (2011)) is itself praiseworthy, as it is quite comprehensive, covering nine different questions about the effect of biodiversity on ecosystem functioning, such as 'does produce species-richness influence the efficiency and productivity of ecosystems?', 'does primary producer richness modify herbivory?' etc. Following each question is a set of hypotheses, taken from the literature, that exemplify the approaches taken by practicing scientists to answer each question. Newman, Varner and Linquist explain the significance of each question along with the plausibility of each hypothesis given the empirical evidence. By using this example, they demonstrate how existing scientific methods (a meta-analysis) can be used to illustrate and support philosophical arguments. This is a valuable lesson for anyone with an 'environmentalist agenda'.

Another technique that increases accessibility to non-philosophers is the inversion of the traditional structure in philosophy textbooks, which often starts with intrinsic value arguments and ends with instrumental value arguments. The instrumental value arguments and their critiques centre on the availability of empirical evidence for each claim, e.g. is there sufficient support from data for the claim that high levels of biodiversity increase tourism? In contrast, the arguments in the second half are more traditionally 'philosophical' hence their evaluation is based on internal coherency, or consistency with established ethical theories. The authors point out that

most (if not all) readers will have come to this book with a general understanding of how scientific hypotheses are formulated and tested, and thus how empirical claims are justified. Many readers, however, will have little or no background in philosophy in general, and in particular with the ways that ethical theories and principles are defended, including claims about what has intrinsic value. (pp 206-207)

By inverting the more traditional structure, but also pointing out repeatedly how the arguments in the first fall short, the authors increase the likelihood that non-philosophers will continue reading into Part II, so as to find out which arguments succeed and why.

The ethical arguments in Part II are explained clearly and are easy to follow even for people with little background in moral philosophy. For example, chapter 7 presents the methodological approaches in ethical discourse succinctly, but in enough detail so that the reader can follow the evaluation of each position in the subsequent chapters. Also, I was very happy to note that the authors took the time to explain that there might be differences in how certain words or phrases are used in philosophy, when compared to how they are used in popular media. An important example can be found in chapter 8, where they point out that the animal welfare/animal rights distinction in philosophy has little to do with the same distinction outside academia, where animal rights activism is seen as much more radical than animal welfare. In philosophy, they explain, the distinction is based on background ethical commitments (i.e. utilitarian versus deontological approaches to ethics).

Newman, Varner and Linquist consistently identify the weaknesses of each argument they present, yet the discussion usually stops there, without addressing whether or how these weaknesses might be overcome. Of course, this might be impossible to do for every single argument, as then the book would double in size. Nonetheless, they could choose to focus on some of the existing arguments. These could be the ones that they thought were the strongest, or the ones that are considered most popular. For example, in chapter 2, they tackle the ecosystem functioning argument, concluding that the empirical evidence only weakly supports the claim that high biodiversity makes ecosystems function better. In addition to the practical difficulties of conducting experiments to investigate this relationship, mentioned above, they also point to many cases where decreasing species richness did not affect ecosystem function, or cases where increasing biodiversity (sometimes with invasive species) lead to a decrease in ecosystem function. Finally, they also point out that in some cases, increasing biodiversity with invasive species could have a positive effect on ecosystem function, but this would go against "other common commitments of environmentalists". Taken together, they see these arguments as a reason to completely abandon the argument from ecosystem functioning.

I agree that the connection between biodiversity and ecosystem stability is deeply problematic, but is this all that can be said? If it were the case that high diversity usually leads to a decrease in ecosystem functioning, then that would arguably be the end of the story. However, as the authors show, there are only some cases where this has been shown to be the case. In other cases, the relationship between increased biodiversity and ecosystem functioning seems to hold, though because it is due to invasive species it is inappropriate within the context of the environmentalist agenda. The problem is that these are different types of arguments, and it would have been useful, given the pedagogical character of the book, to have some philosophical reflection on this. Which argument is strongest? Would overcoming only a subset of these arguments be sufficient for the ecosystem functioning defence? Do these arguments trade off against each other? Could such a tradeoff be used by environmentalists in any way? This is a missed opportunity to provide deeper philosophical reflection that would be useful for the reader, but would also confer some novelty to the argument. As stated above, providing 'new' arguments from the integration or re-examination of existing views is both common and important in philosophy.

My second worry concerns chapters 6 and 12, the chapters at the end of each. Part of the problem is that it is not entirely clear what the purpose of these chapters is. The discussion in the introduction states that each is meant to take stock of the arguments presented in its section, and to show 'how far they get environmentalists'. The implication is that they will provide a more abstract consideration of the defences in each section. This would be a natural place to examine if and how any of the weaknesses of each argument could be overcome. Doing so would address my first criticism, presented above. Alternatively, the authors could synthesize the existing arguments and thus provide a novel defence of biodiversity. For example, chapter 6 could include an examination of the strengths of the instrumental arguments when taken together, or a more abstract examination of anthropocentric instrumental defences, in general.

Instead, most of the chapter is a summary of each argument and a very short concluding section that focuses mainly on reiterating the dangers of not taking seriously the shortcomings of one's arguments. While the authors do ask the question "what about the conjunction of these views taken together?" (p. 200), their response is too brief:

We don't think this helps much, because individually several of these instrumental defences have unpalatable implied commitments -- commitments that are at odds with others [sic] parts of the agenda. Putting these defences together does not alleviate these implied commitments. (p. 200)

They then give an example, i.e. that relying on ecosystem functioning defence implies that we should sometimes accept introduced species, but that this goes against the environmentalist agenda. Furthermore, "adding food, medicine, ecotourist, or transformative value defenses probably doesn't alleviate this problem with non-native species" (p. 201). They follow this up with one paragraph on how the "anthropocentric ethical stance" is valuable but limited (for all the reasons in each of the previous chapters), and then immediately go on to setting up the argument for intrinsic value arguments. They dismiss the option of 'biting the bullet', i.e. admitting that "while we have very good reasons for conserving some bits of biodiversity, we lack a general reason to conserve all of biodiversity", without any discussion (p. 201).

Again, I believe that this is a missed opportunity to examine a novel and potentially useful argument for environmentalists. Why should we not adopt a position that synthesizes all the available instrumentalist arguments? How far would we get if we added up all the 'bits of biodiversity' that existing arguments support? What if we added the aesthetic argument and the argument for the intrinsic value of sentient organisms? Are there genuine insurmountable tradeoffs between 'different parts of the environmentalist agenda' or can they be overcome? If there are genuine tradeoffs, does this mean that some parts of the 'environmentalist agenda' should be abandoned? Alternatively, should we employ a piecemeal, pluralistic defence of biodiversity conservation?

I am not claiming that this argument would definitely end up being adequate, but it would have been helpful, I think, if the authors had explored it. As things stand, we are left with a note of pessimism at end of chapter 13. The goal of this book was to critique existing arguments in order to make them stronger, yet the critique seems to have left them broken. What should we do in light of this? What options are open to us now? I think that the authors could have dedicated a bit more discussion in chapters 6 and 12 to this question.

While the book would benefit from a deeper analysis of pluralism or synthesis regarding arguments for biodiversity conservation, it is still a valuable examination of the topic as it stands. It is refreshing to read a philosophical book that is neither insular nor esoteric, especially given the broad appeal and interest in biodiversity conservation. Newman, Varner and Linquist's book highlights what philosophy does best: employing rigorous thinking and argumentation to make one's position stronger. Unfortunately, we live in a world where this sort of endeavour is no longer merely a heuristic for good practice, but essential. Luckily, with the publication of this book, we now have a reliable guide for the task, at least when it comes to biodiversity conservation.


Cardinale, B.J., Matulich, K/L, Hooper, D.U., et al (2011). The functional role of producer diversity in ecosystems. American Journal of Botany, 98, 572-592.

H.J.Res.69 -- Providing for congressional disapproval under chapter 8 of title 5, United States Code, of the final rule of the Department of the Interior relating to "Non-Subsistence Take of Wildlife, and Public Participation and Closure Procedures, on National Wildlife Refuges in Alaska".

Popovich, N., Albeck-Ripka, L. & Pierre-Louis, K. (2018) 76 Environmental Rules on the way out Under Trump. The New York Times.