Defending the Axioms: On the Philosophical Foundations of Set Theory

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Penelope Maddy, Defending the Axioms: On the Philosophical Foundations of Set Theory, Oxford University Press, 2011, 150pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199596188.

Reviewed by Mary Tiles, University of Hawaii at Mānoa


As outlined in her Preface, this short work forms a step in Maddy's trajectory from her early realism (Realism in Mathematics, 1990) through a naturalist attempt to bypass philosophical issues of truth and existence by focusing on how arguments for or against set-theoretic principles should be evaluated (Naturalism in Mathematics, 1997) to a return to consideration of questions of truth and existence (Second Philosophy, 2007) and this most recent work. It should be noted in passing that throughout her work Maddy has consistently concentrated on set theory, even though the earlier titles suggest a broader concern with the philosophy of mathematics. This suggests at least tacit acceptance of the view that mathematics can be reduced to set theory, something that persists in the new work which although explicitly about set theory frequently presents itself as a discussion about the nature of mathematics. Whether this view can remain part of a stable or coherent naturalist position is a question that deserves discussion, but is not present in this work.

The questions Maddy sets out to answer are "What are set theorists doing?" and "How are they managing to do it?" which are Maddy's own way of phrasing questions driving an investigation into the subject matter and methods of contemporary set theory. The philosophical approach is a form of naturalism (dubbed Second Philosophy to distinguish it from any metaphysically freighted first philosophy, p. 40). This naturalis portrays itself as continuous with and internal to activities of natural science, with mathematics viewed as an extension of scientific inquiry into natural phenomena. It claims no special views on the nature of science and foreswears any critical perspective on either science or mathematics that is not part of the normal critical discourse about reliability internal to those disciplines. The Second Philosopher's strategy is to begin with methods, find them good, and devise a minimal metaphysics to suit the case.

It is thus hardly surprising to learn that the justification for set-theoretic axioms is not to be found in some special "intuition" revealing the true nature of sets (intrinsic), or by appeal to an ontology or epistemology, but in their wider mathematical fruitfulness (extrinsic) -- "all that really matters is the fruitfulness and promise of the mathematics itself" (p. 117). But how does this answer the questions Maddy set out to answer? The body of the book takes us round a number of sophisticated epicycles through possible philosophical positions that might be answering these questions, but one cannot help feeling that in the end we are being told that if we want answers to these questions we should learn some set theory and much other mathematics besides, become part of the mathematical community and acquire a mathematician's sense of what (objectively) constitutes mathematical depth and power.

There is of course a slight problem with such advice in that not all mathematicians are equally enamoured of set theory and many prefer to ignore it. Given the "motley" of contemporary mathematics (to borrow Wittgenstein's phrase) and the near impossibility of mastering all branches one might wonder where to start. With the increased power and role of computers arise new issues both about the status of computer-generated proofs and the role of quasi-experimental computer methods of exploring the properties of mathematical structures. These and other changes prompted mathematician Ian Stewart to say that the very distinction between pure and applied mathematics, stressed by Maddy, "is looking increasingly artificial, increasingly dated, and increasingly unhelpful" (Stewart 1996 p. 280). Maddy's account is for pure mathematics only.

So to what extent does the path to the final position provide answers to the questions Maddy set out to answer? To her credit Maddy recognizes that it might help to have an historical perspective on the emergence of contemporary set theory, including a discussion of the separation of pure from applied mathematics. Since this is covered in the first chapter, it is necessarily a very cursory glance at the history of mathematics. Maddy is quite up front about her reliance on others for this history, but it is perhaps unfortunate that she relies so heavily on Morris Kline's highly Eurocentric and somewhat dated, internalist approach. It is the fairly standard story of how there came to be a quest for secure mathematical foundations, which is also the story of the rise of set theory. From this she derives three lessons (p. 27). The first is that pure mathematics was the result of mathematicians' urge to "pursue a range of purely mathematical goals with no immediate connection to applications". The second is that Euclidean geometry is no longer regarded as the true theory of physical space but is merely the study of one among many abstract mathematical spaces. The third is that "even applied mathematics is pure" in that "our best mathematical accounts of physical phenomena are free standing models that resemble the world in complex ways but do not express literal truths about it." There are other stories that have been told and other lessons that could be drawn, but this is the narrative Maddy uses to set her stage.

It is perhaps worth noting that there are two standards of "purity" at work here. One concerns subject matter -- if this is abstract rather than concrete its investigation is counted as pure. The second concerns reasons for investigation, the kinds of questions raised and problems posed -- if these are driven by concerns internal to mathematics, rather than from other subject areas (applications), then to attempt to solve them is to engage in pure mathematics. These two standards do not draw the same boundary line between pure and impure; the study by climatologists of mathematical/computer climate models, for example, is pure in the first sense but certainly not in the second, even though in their search for ways to reduce computational explosions associated with construction of finer-grained models climatologists may be drawn into investigating the properties of computational algorithms. Maddy would, it seems, count this as (pure) applied mathematics. Her concern is with (pure) pure mathematics which she (following Kline) portrays as emerging toward the end of the nineteenth century with the demotion of mathematics from revealer of the structure of the world (Newton and Galileo) to provider of toolkits for mathematical modelers.

The scene is then set for the emergence of set theory and Zermelo's axiomatisation of it as part of the foundational concern with finding standards of legitimacy and proof for new branches of mathematics. With not much discussion Maddy quickly hops over the foundational issues, taking the more nuanced and seemingly more neutral view that the role of set theory is "to provide a generous, unified arena to which all local questions of proof can be referred. . . . facilitate interconnections between disparate branches of mathematics now all uniformly represented; formulate and answer questions of provability and refutability; open the door to strong new hypotheses to settle old open questions; and so on." (p. 34) It is in this mathematical, rather than philosophical, sense that she claims that set theory provides a foundation for contemporary pure mathematics. (One could note that in this mathematical sense set theory is not unique; category theory can also play that foundational-in-the-sense-of-unifying role.) So the remaining questions are "What are the proper methods of set theory and why?"

Much of the chapter on proper methods is devoted to undermining the claims of Robust Realism. If we (mathematicians) prefer set-theoretic axioms that fulfill our foundational-in-the-sense-of-unifying goals, or for their other mathematical advantages, why should an independent set-theoretic reality be aligned with those preferences? How would positing such a reality help justify existing practice? The Second Philosopher finds it to be of no help and faults Robust Realism. She then attempts a retreat into so-called Thin Realism. The Second Philosopher, posing as an empirical scientist examining a salient human practice (p. 61), has already committed to the existing mathematical methods of set theorists as the proper methods for learning about sets, but now faces the challenge of explaining what makes them reliable: "What must sets be like for this to be so?" (p. 61) Since the Second Philosopher favours Occam's razor she is likely to want to say that sets are just the things that set theory describes. But the Thin Realist also wants to avoid saying that sets are constituted by set-theoretic methods since she wants sets to be objective, independent entities in the sense that there is more to them than set theory tells us. (p. 66) This realism is expressed in a retention of commitment to bivalence and the idea that, for example, the Continuum Hypothesis (CH) will eventually be settled as either true or false in the standard set-theoretic universe. But what justifies that faith? A thin epistemology that says that we do not learn about sets directly and that there isn't anything that could count as evidence that all our beliefs about sets are wrong, doesn't justify the belief that all questions about sets have a yes/no answer.

Maddy senses her vulnerability here as she returns to try again (p. 77) to say what objective reality it is that underlies and constrains set-theoretic methods. She briefly mentions, without further comment, the role of classical logic (discussed at greater length in Maddy 2007), which is claimed here to be legitimately used in the case of set theory, because the set-theoretic universe V satisfies the conditions for its use. So, she can then say that what the set theorist learns from the theorem "CH v not-CH" is that in the single set-theoretic structure V she is describing, one of CH or not-CH is true. (p. 80) What her discussion bypasses is the source of the conception of a unique standard set-theoretic universe. Since non-standard (and in particular Boolean-valued) models of the axioms abound, this conception is not grounded in the axioms themselves. Moreover, we know from Gödel's first incompleteness theorem that no matter what stronger axioms are added, if the resulting theory is consistent, there will remain sentences formulable within the language of set theory that are neither provable nor refutable. So what privileges standard over non-standard interpretations? What makes the cumulative hierarchy seem a "natural" interpretation and what grounds the uniqueness assumption underpinning the resort to classical logic? This seems to be where more than a thin realism creeps in, and the problem stems in part from clinging to the idea that set theory consists in a body of truths.

Maddy goes on in her fourth chapter to explore the possibility of doing without this assumption -- a position she labels Arealism. This position regards pure mathematics as a spectacularly successful enterprise but one in which set theory is constrained solely by its own mathematical goals. However, the Arealist portrayed here will still talk about V as a universe of sets and about results as holding within it. The only difference between the Thin Realist and the Arealist is said to be external to set theory. After some peregrinations, the question is boiled down to "Does the history and current practice of pure mathematics qualify it as just another item on the list with physics, chemistry, biology, sociology, geology, and so on?" (p. 111) If so, honorifics like 'true', 'exist', and 'evidence' belong in pure mathematics, since they are presumed to be indisputably at home in these other disciplines, but if not, then use of these honorifics may not be justified. And here at least the Second Philosopher abandons her classical logic and acknowledges that there may be no determinate answer to the question, instead preferring to conclude that "the two idioms are equally well supported by precisely the same objective reality", namely, the facts about mathematical depth and significance that underlie mathematical practice.

This account of objectivity in mathematics does not invoke a specifically mathematical ontology, nor does it deny its existence; it merely invokes a mathematician's sense of mathematical importance and depth. The importance of set theory lies in its unifying role of "bringing all mathematical structures together in a single arena and codifying the fundamental assumptions of mathematical proof." (p. 133) Its axioms are justified to the extent that they facilitate this role; no further philosophical justification is required. The conclusion would seem thus to be that there are no philosophical foundations for set theory; its grounding lies in the mathematical practices for which it was once proposed as a foundation. And since presumably the same could be said for category theory there should be no question of which is the correct foundational theory, although Maddy makes no mention of category theory.

But what has this tour of abandoned philosophic postures told us about set theory or mathematics? The message seems to be that these are autonomous disciplines with their own standards of objectivity, that there is no critical purchase that the philosopher could or should hope to bring to bear on them. As such, this work is of a pattern recognised by Bourdieu:

science, and especially the legitimacy of science and the legitimate use of science, are, at every moment, at stake in struggles within the social world and even within the world of science. It follows that what is called epistemology is always in danger of being no more than a form of justificatory discourse serving to justify science or a particular position in the scientific field, or a spuriously neutralized reproduction of the dominant discourse of science about itself. (Bourdieu (2004) p. 6)

It reproduces the dominant discourse of a sector of pure mathematics about itself while denying legitimate access to non-dominant discourses. While not denying that set theorists have internalised a sense of objectivity, there are grounds for thinking that this sense cannot be the sole arbiter of reliability when it comes to non-mathematical uses of their products. Alchemists and astrologers too had well-grounded senses of the objectivity of their disciplines. As Bourdieu notes,

The agent engaged in practice knows the world but with a knowledge which, as Merleau-Ponty showed, is not set up in the relation of externality of a knowing consciousness. He knows it, in a sense, too well, without objectifying distance, takes it for granted, precisely because he is caught up in it, bound up with it; he inhabits it like a garment [un habit] a familiar habitat. He feels at home in the world because the world is also in him, in the form of habitus, a virtue made of necessity which implies a form of love of necessity, amor fati. (Bourdieu (2000) p. 143)

It is in discerning the "unconscious" of a discipline, through the social, material and intellectual conditions of its historical production that a broader understanding of its nature and roles may be discerned in a manner that does not close off the possibility of critical debate. Maddy made a start by beginning with history, but she excluded the social conditions crucially implicated in the separation of pure from applied mathematics. If we are to understand today's repositionings of bits of mathematics we also need to understand their social and practical as well as their scientific and mathematical drivers.

I think the unconscious of a discipline is its history; its unconscious is made up of its social conditions of production masked and forgotten. The product, separated from its social conditions of production, changes its meaning and exerts an ideological effect. Knowing what one is doing when one does science -- that's a simple definition of epistemology -- presupposes knowing how the problems, tools, methods and concepts that one uses have been historically formed. (Bourdieu (1993) p. 50)


Bourdieu, Pierre (1993) Sociology in Question, trans. Richard Nice. (London,UK, Thousand Oaks, CA and New Delhi: Sage Publications Ltd), originally published in 1984 as Questions de Sociologie. (Paris: Les Editions de Minuit)

Bourdieu, Pierre (2000), Pascalian Meditations, trans. Richard Nice. (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press), originally published 1997 as Méditations pascaliennes. (Paris: Editions du Seuil)

Bourdieu, Pierre (2004), Science of Science and Reflexivity, trans. Richard Nice. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press), originally published 2001 as Science de la science et réflexivité. (Paris: Éditions Raisons d'Agir)

Stewart, Ian (1996) From Here to Infinity: A Guide to Today's Mathematics (3rd edition), Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press