Deflating Existential Consequence: A Case for Nominalism

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Jody Azzouni, Deflating Existential Consequence: A Case for Nominalism, Oxford University Press, 2004, 256pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195159888.

Reviewed by Joseph Melia, University of Leeds


Mathematics presents the nominalist with his biggest problem for, in its standard formulation, its truth seems to entail the existence of a large infinity of objects that cannot be fitted into the concrete world. Most modern nominalists respond either by searching for paraphrases or by denying the literal truth of mathematics. In this book, Azzouni argues that the truth of mathematics is quite compatible with the rejection of mathematical entities. The apparent problem for nominalism arose only because metaphysicians have mistakenly employed Quine's criterion of ontological commitment. In this book, Azzouni develops a rival criterion and examines the existential consequences of his novel ontological framework.

In chapters 1 and 2, Azzouni begins by setting out his reasons for accepting the truth of mathematics. Azzouni develops what he takes to be a plausible version of the indispensability argument, and he argues that, despite the criticisms of recent nominalists such as Field and Maddy, the conclusion of the argument is inescapable: mathematics is true. Commitment to numbers is to be avoided by rejecting Quine's criterion of ontological commitment. Accordingly, in chapter 3, Azzouni examines the motivation for Quine's criterion and argues that there are no good, non-circular arguments for accepting that existential quantification -- even familiar first-order objectual existential quantification -- over Fs should commit us to the existence of Fs. In chapter 4, Azzouni asks whether there are any criteria for existence itself. He argues that, as a matter of sociological fact, the criterion for existence that we have adopted is that of ontological independence. The thought here is that if an entity's properties depend wholly upon us -- as, for example, in the case of fictional objects -- then that entity exists 'in no sense at all'. Azzouni argues that an entity's ontological independence is crucially bound up with our epistemic access to it: if an object is ontologically independent of us, then all our methods for establishing truths about such objects must be non-trivial. Azzouni argues that mathematics is ontologically dependent upon us, since the properties of mathematical objects are established in a way that is trivial. Accordingly, mathematical objects do not exist.

In the second half of the book, Azzouni turns his attention to the posits of applied mathematics. In chapter 6, Azzouni distinguishes three kinds of posits depending upon the epistemic burdens that they bear. Ultrathin posits have no epistemic burden at all. Examples of these appear in pure mathematics where, according to Azzouni, objects and their properties are simply postulated. Thin posits are those which both 'pay Quinean rent' -- i.e. they are postulated because of the simplification and unification they bring to our theories -- and are such that an explanation exists for why we do not have more direct access to them. Finally, thick posits are ones that can be seen, felt or with which we can indirectly interact. For Azzouni, whether or not we should be committed to a certain posit depends upon the kind of epistemic access we have to it. In chapter 7, Azzouni argues that the only entities that really are ontologically independent of us are those that are causally efficacious, and that the only entities that exist are those that are thick and thin -- ultrathin entities are to be eliminated from our ontology. Azzouni ends the book by examining some examples of applied mathematics in the context of certain simplified Newtonian theories, and he investigates in the light of the ontological apparatus that has been developed which posits of these theories we should believe in. His conclusions go beyond strict nominalism: it is not only abstract objects that should be rejected from our ontology but, because of the role they turn out to play in our scientific theories, forces and space-time must also be rejected.

The positions that Azzouni develops here are bold and contentious. Whether or not one ultimately accepts the positions that emerge, this book contains many interesting arguments and original ideas which are relevant to much recent work in both metaphysics and the philosophy of mathematics. Though dealing with some advanced and occasionally formal topics, Azzouni's style is relaxed, humorous and easy-going throughout which makes the book very enjoyable to read the first time through. There were times when the style became a little too relaxed, and I found that the structure and nature of the argument was hard to pin down precisely, even after several readings. Though it is surely helpful to motivate new concepts and ideas by illustration and example, there were occasions when more precise definitions or analyses would also have been helpful. Nevertheless, Azzouni deals with the subject matter in a lively and engaging way and one that is certainly worth reading.

I turn now to some objections and criticisms. I begin with Azzouni's opening arguments for the truth of mathematics. Much recent nominalist work in the philosophy of mathematics has concentrated on undermining the indispensability argument. Azzouni argues that the indispensability argument stands. Thus, although Field has argued that mathematics is in fact dispensable, Azzouni points out that Field's programme is incomplete and, more importantly, does nothing to eliminate the practical indispensability of mathematics. I would have liked to see a little more detail here. True, Field's programme is incomplete, but the question is the degree to which Field's success in nominalising certain simple physical theories undermines our confidence in the premise that mathematics will play an indispensable role in modern complicated ones. Nothing Azzouni says supports the idea that the methods and ideas developed by Field cannot be successfully extended. Moreover, I could not see why Azzouni thought the practical indispensability of mathematics is so important. Adopting powerful mathematical systems may well allow us to speed up certain calculations that would otherwise be too practically difficult to carry out. But if we know that these derivations are possible (though not practically possible) in our nominalist reformulations, then that is enough to show the mathematics is, after all, dispensable.

Even if Field's programme fails, why is it not possible to take a purely instrumental attitude towards mathematics? Unlike many supporters of the indispensability argument, Azzouni admits that there can be empirically indispensable theories that do not have to be taken as true. But he takes the following question as key: 'how does the difference in attitude toward sentences we take to be true and toward sentences we take instrumentally manifest itself' (p. 35). The answer is that, if a theory is taken instrumentally, then we quarantine the non-instrumental implications of the theory from our body of beliefs. However, says Azzouni, scientists do not engage in the practice of placing in quarantine some of the implications of such theories, and so philosophers have no grounds for being agnostic regarding the truth of these theories. I had three worries with this line of argument. (1) agnostics do not necessarily need grounds for their agnosticism; (2) Some philosophers are instrumentalists because of doubts about inference to the best explanation or induction; whether or not scientists quarantine the implications of their beliefs will not help assuage such doubts; (3) It is not as clear to me as it seems to be to Azzouni that scientists don't engage in the practice of quarantining; scientists can be very hesitant about asserting 'there are unobservable objects', or 'there are mathematical entities', even though these are implications of their total theory.

The part of the book which, if true, would have the most impact is Azzouni's rejection of Quine's criterion of ontological commitment. For many, the best argument in its favour is the triviality thesis: the existential quantifier just means 'there is', and 'there is' just carries ontological commitment. Azzouni thinks the triviality thesis is wrong since there are assertions of the form 'there are Fs' that do not always carry ontological commitment. For instance, suppose we discovered a children's story according to which there were mice that talked. In such a context it would be right to assert 'there are fictional mice that talk'. Nevertheless, it would be absurd to think that anyone who uttered this sentence in such a context would actually take herself to be committed to the existence of fictional mice. Azzouni investigates a number of ways to try and save the triviality thesis, including the following: (a) show that such quantification over fictional mice can be paraphrased away; (b) claim that this sentence contains a metaphorical or pretend use of 'there is'; (c) claim the word 'fictional' operates in such a way as to cancel the existential import of the quantifier. Azzouni examines these and other responses and argues that none of them is entirely satisfactory. For instance (c) fails as there are a large number of other uses of 'there is' not involving the fiction operator 'that speakers clearly don't want to be ontologically committing' (p.77).

I was puzzled by this move. The mere fact that a speaker doesn't want his sentences to imply the existence of Fs doesn't mean that the sentences don't imply the existence of Fs. Working out the ontological commitments of a discourse is one thing, what we want the ontological commitments of a discourse to be seems to be quite another. But setting this aside, Azzouni's appeal to other uses of 'there is' allows the defender of the triviality thesis to use different strategies for different problematic examples. Just because the paraphrase strategy fails for sentences involving the fiction operator doesn't mean that the Quinean can never use this strategy, and such a strategy might be exactly right for dealing with the other uses of 'there is' that Azzouni mentions. To this second worry, Azzouni says that the relevant paraphrases must be 'easily accessible to speakers and naturally adopted' (p.78). This is a fair challenge, but Azzouni does little to show it cannot be met. Instead, he urges that, when pressed on a contentious 'there is' claim, a speaker is more likely to deny the object's existence than come up with a paraphrase. But so what? How does the existence of a distinction between the meaning of 'there is' and 'exists' follow from this? Many speakers who assert 'there are four numbers between 0 and 10' seem to me to be reluctant to agree that the bald sentence 'there are numbers' is true -- indeed, they seem as reluctant to assert this as they are to assert that 'numbers exist' is true.

Though the book is very interesting and contains many things with which many nominalists would surely sympathise, I would have liked to see Azzouni's own anti-Quinean view of ontology developed and defended in greater detail. Azzouni's own arguments in favour of his own criterion -- that of ontological independence -- were a little slender and in need of greater development. It may indeed be true that sentences such as 'Although there are cities in H. P. Lovecraft stories that exist, there are places that don't exist that he depicts as being located in those cities' (p.98) are indeed natural, I couldn't see how this supported the idea that ontological independence is in any sense a criterion for existence. Moreover, the key notion of ontological independence itself was in need of a more thorough explanation. Azzouni's examples of ontological independence are fictional entities. But not everyone agrees that fictional entities are non-existent, so it would be useful if the notion of ontological independence could be spelled out independently of this particular example. But when one tries to do this, it's not at all clear that one gets a criterion for what exists. After all, from a naive point of view, it would seem that psychological states and brain states and words are entirely ontologically dependent on us: were there no humans around such states simply would not exist. Azzouni takes care to point out that he is not in the business of denying their existence (p.98) but he doesn't offer any account of ontological independence which would avoid such a difficulty.

Finally, it was never entirely clear to me whether Azzouni took himself to be proposing an alternative criterion for the ontological commitments of a discourse, or does he actually think the search for such a criterion is fundamentally mistaken? Although there were times in this book when Azzouni hints that ontological questions have no determinate answers, I was unsure how seriously Azzouni took this view. After all, the thrust of the book seems to defend a kind of nominalism. If ontological questions really are indeterminate, then doesn't the truth of nominalism become indeterminate too? If he is defending such a view, I did not find his arguments compelling. Consider, for example, the discussion in chapter 4. Although Azzouni admits he thinks it very plausible that whatever exists must not be ontologically dependent on any linguistic or psychological process, he then goes on to reject this as a criterion of existence. His reason is that, if there were to exist a community of speakers who believed in the existence of fictional entities (as, indeed, certain aestheticians do believe), there would be no non-question begging way of arguing this community out of this existential belief. Azzouni concludes that, philosophically, it is indeterminate whether fictional entities exist. But how does this conclusion follow? For sure, there may be no interesting, non-circular arguments that defend one set of criteria over another, it may be that one particularly incoherent group of people cannot be made to see their incoherence. But this doesn't mean that there are no right answers, or that this community isn't incoherent.

Despite these criticisms, such worries do not detract from the fact that this is an exciting and provocative book defending an original combination of views which deserves to stimulate discussion in foundational ontological issues and in the philosophy of mathematics.