Degrees of Givenness: On Saturation in Jean-Luc Marion

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Christina M. Gschwandtner, Degrees of Givenness: On Saturation in Jean-Luc Marion, Indiana University Press, 2014, 279pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253014191.

Reviewed by Kevin Hart, The University of Virginia


Jean-Luc Marion has claim to be considered the most important living phenomenologist, certainly in France and perhaps also in the world. His work, especially since the English translation of Étant donné (1997; corrected edition 1998) as Being Given (2002), has attracted much commentary.[1] There is indeed a great deal to consider in his writing: his account of the history of philosophy, principally seventeenth-century French philosophy (Descartes, in particular) and twentieth-century phenomenology; his approach to Christian theology, especially the doctrine of God and the philosophy (rather than theology) of revelation; his examination of the human self as l'adonné; his philosophy of art, including interpretations of particular painters, most notably Courbet; his engagement with Augustine's Confessions and, more generally, his readings of other Church Fathers; and his views about love, both human and divine. In the main, however, Marion's investigations of saturated phenomena have been the chief focus of admiration and reserve alike. Réduction et donation (1989) marks the passage from Marion as a historian of philosophy to a philosopher as such, for it is there that he makes his breakthrough, one which enables him to see that some phenomena are saturated with intuition and exceed determinations by concepts and intentionality alike.[2]

In Being Given Marion has recourse to Kant's distinctions in the first Critique among quantity, quality, relation and mode in specifying the ways in which saturation occurs. So we find his thought constellating around events that offer too much intuition for us to accommodate, idols (including paintings and sculptures) that dazzle us with sensuous intensity, the flesh that overwhelms us because no analogy can be formed to harness its immediacy, and the human face that overflows any intentional rapport we might try to establish with it. Saturation can itself be saturated, as happens, Marion thinks, in the Judeo-Christian understanding of revelation, which is the topic of his 2014 Gifford lectures at Glasgow.[3] Not that, as some readers have supposed, saturation is always an extraordinary event; it can be utterly banal, Marion argues: I am faced with saturated phenomena each and every day, just as I am with common-law phenomena (in which intuition is merely adequate to concept) and poor phenomena (in which one finds little or no intuition).[4] These categories do not set the limits of phenomenality; for example, it is possible for a common-law phenomenon to become saturated with intuition if the one who sees it is also open to receive it. I can merely see a flowering dogwood on my street and then, under different circumstances on another day, it might actually appear to me: "appearance" and "saturation" are co-ordinate notions for Marion.[5]

Christina M. Gschwandtner has established herself as a valued reader of contemporary French philosophy in general and of Marion's writings in particular. She was the first to consider at length Marion's extensive reflections on Descartes and to evaluate their theological importance, and she has translated two of Marion's books from the French. This new study, Degrees of Givenness, extends her contribution to our understanding of this fecund philosopher.[6] It is clearly written, attentive to many things that Marion has done, and, more impressively, alert to what his work opens up for others to do if he does not do it himself in years to come. One might summarize Gschwandtner's overall view of Marion's work in this new book in Wallace Stevens' potent words, "the accomplishment / Of an extremist in an exercise."[7] For she maintains that Marion tends to figure the givenness of phenomena in an excessive way whereas a just estimation of phenomena, including some that Marion does not consider (such as the natural world), would incline us to think in terms of fine degrees of givenness. Accordingly, we read that saturation, for Marion, is conceived "primarily in very excessive terms" (xi), that he has an "almost exclusive focus on the most excessive instances of the given" (1), that his inquiry into love presents "an excessive picture of romantic infatuation" (8), that his focus is "on the most excessive and extreme phenomena" (76), that to think of eros in theological terms, and indeed of chastity as the cardinal erotic virtue, is "too extreme" (110), that prayer does not always appear in the "excessive ways" that Marion thinks it does (162), that the Eucharist is understood by Marion in an "absolute and excessive nature" (181), and that he keeps a "single-minded focus" on the self-givenness of phenomena and, indeed, takes it "almost exclusively" as the experience of a solitary individual (186). Is Gschwandtner right to think of Marion in this way?

In one sense, yes, she surely is. Marion is unlike his eminent French colleagues Paul Ricœur and Jacques Derrida in that he does not seek an irenic synthesis of competing views (Ricœur) or maintain that those very views must be figured by way of irreducible difference (Derrida). Rather, he resembles Michel Henry and Emmanuel Levinas in that he adopts a position and, not looking to left or right, develops it very sharply indeed. We think of Henry as insisting, in book after book, on the primacy of phenomenality over the phenomenon, and of Levinas as slowly developing, decade after decade, a more radical sense of the priority of the other person with respect to me. Similarly, Marion runs fast with the idea of saturation and hardly seems to look back or even to the side. Only recently has he been responding in print to criticisms and caveats about his discussion of saturation. Yet we need to ask, more profoundly, why Marion uses such extreme language if Gschwandtner is right to castigate him for doing so and if she has reason to argue for degrees of givenness rather than for absolute givenness. To answer effectively I will have to speak quite a bit about Marion and Husserl rather than directly about Gschwandtner.

There have been, and still are, two principal ways in which Marion has been read by his admirers and critics, especially in the English-speaking world where the terms of his reception were early set in place by the translation of Dieu sans l'être (1982; 1991; 2013) as God without Being (1991).[8] That provocative little book inclined Anglophone readers to take Marion as a postmodern thinker, someone in creative and critical dialog with Heidegger and Derrida, and those same readers have clung to that initial impression with impressive tenacity. For them, Marion's Descartes is our contemporary; saturated phenomena, in their paradoxical way of overturning cause and effect, along with other relations, perform a deconstruction of earlier notions of phenomena; and the influence of Levinas on Marion justifies seeing his analysis of love, based on counter-intentionality, as post-modern as well. There is textual support in Marion for this reading as well as sharp irritants to it, none more galling to many advocates of postmodernism than Marion's apparent rejection of hermeneutics in favor of the absolute givenness of phenomena.[9] Gschwandtner belongs, for all intents and purposes, in this first group. Of course, she is aware of the second main way of understanding Marion: as a phenomenologist who extends Husserl's and Heidegger's insights, chiefly by way of a new elaboration of reduction.[10] On this reading, Heideggerian Destruktion and Derridean déconstruction are moments in a winding, overarching history of phenomenology, moments that turn on making much of Husserl's analysis of sedimentation and passive syntheses and (with Derrida) Eugen Fink's proposal of pre-existent constitution ("vor-seienden" Konstitution).[11] Marion appears in this reading as an unusual philosopher: a radical Heideggerian who became, when he stepped forth as a historian of phenomenology, more and more impressed by Husserl. In part, this engagement with Husserl allowed him to contest Derrida's reading of the Logical Investigations (and hence one base of deconstruction), and in part it encouraged him to take seriously Husserl's early work once he had departed from descriptive phenomenology and had begun to explore it as transcendental philosophy.

In terms of this second reading, which I have proposed and defended, Marion takes his stand at the very moment when Husserl begins to develop phenomenology as a philosophical position, complete with an idea of reduction. This is the Husserl of The Idea of Phenomenology, given as five lectures at Göttingen in early 1907 as the introduction to his course now published in English as Thing and Space.[12] Phenomenology in 1907 is a Cartesian enterprise, not a psychological one, and it begins by way of critique of natural cognition in the sciences, including psychology. This critique has two consequences: it gives rise to metaphysics understood as thinking the essence of cognition and establishing the proper correlations of thinking and being, and it also generates phenomenology, which is to be understood as "clarifying the essence of cognition and of being an object of cognition" (The Idea of Phenomenology, 18). Phenomenology has the aim of epistemic certainty and is inspired by the method of Cartesian doubt; it seeks a ground more secure than what is offered by the natural sciences. This ground is to be found in immanence, Husserl says, by which he means two things. First, there is the immanence of the stream of cogitationes, and, second, there is the immanence of particulars and essences that are self-given and constituted in Evidenz. It is this second mode of immanence that particularly interests Husserl. The way to it is found in what he calls "reduction," a mental askesis that brackets the transcendence of an entity by way of presupposition. (Transcendence, then, is taken as anything that is outside consciousness.) Transcendent objects have only a "quasi-givenness" (35) but when their existence is bracketed they can be brought, as phenomena, to the immanence of consciousness and are then characterized by "absolute givenness" (35) or, better, "absolute self-givenness" (6, 7, 28, 40, 41) which is constituted by "pure evidence" [i.e., Evidenz] (6, 40).

So here we have the basis for Marion's language of absolutes and purity: the claims are required in order to establish a rigorous study of phenomena without recourse to the transcendence of entities in the natural world. Husserl details the different modes of givenness -- in anticipation, thought, recollection, perception, imagination, and so on -- and, as a part of this, is able to detail the various ways in which phenomena are present and absent to the transcendental aspect of consciousness. In short, the rationale for hermeneutics is already within phenomenology, although, to be sure, more needs to be said to bring hermeneutics more fully into its own. Phenomena offer different degrees of Evidenz in distinct modes of being: for example, arithmetic, which consists of weak phenomena, offers an extremely high degree of Evidenz, but perception of quotidian objects does not. Hence Husserl's insistence on training one's sight so that one can secure "the absolute clarity of the given" (ibid, 7). That training consists of practicing reduction, of leading transcendent entities to the transcendental aspect of consciousness, so that, in the end, one can even "'see' the 'seeing'" (24) that one is doing. None of this, however, guarantees apodictic knowledge of any particular phenomenon, for "givenness extends just as far as actual evidence" (58). One might say, therefore, that "degrees of givenness" is exactly what Husserl specifies, for we are always constrained by Evidenz, the process by which something becomes (more or less) self-evident, and these degrees are more fine-grained than the distinctions between weak, common law and saturated phenomena.

Marion returns to the Husserl of The Idea of Phenomenology because it is there that the German philosopher sees most clearly that phenomenology is a matter of the self-giving of phenomena, which requires intuition. Marion argues that later, in the first volume of Husserl's Ideas (1913), this radical claim is modified: intentionality becomes the chief motor of phenomenology. Marion's originality, we might say, consists in rediscovering the original insight of Husserl and following it through as consequentially as possible. Curiously, this exercise in fidelity requires a major departure from Husserl, which is inspired by Heidegger's determination, early in Being and Time (1927), that phenomenality turns wholly on the phenomenon, not on the human being figured as a subject (as happens in Descartes, Kant, and Husserl). Following Heidegger's rethinking of the human subject as Dasein, Marion finds no role for transcendental consciousness to play and insists, rather, on the primacy of self-givenness (and, secondarily, on intuition and Evidenz): the human being merely receives phenomena and does not constitute them. Hence Marion's account of the human being as l'adonné, the one born to the gift of givenness, and of his picture of the genius as the one who is open to more of the self-given than the ordinary person. (Shakespeare: the very model of the man not of "capable imagination" but of supremely capable reception, of which imagination is only one mode in which being can be received.[13])

To do justice to Marion would be to acknowledge his Husserlian inheritance as well as the Heideggerian adjustment of it and hence his radical commitment to absolute self-givenness as the very basis of phenomenology. In his lapidary formulation, "So much reduction, so much givenness."[14] How much reduction and of what sort are questions to ask here; another is how one would know if reduction has been fully or even properly performed.[15] Marion countenances these questions, as he must, when he wonders whether givenness admits of degree.[16] But let us put these questions to one side and consider something more basic, that, even if givenness is fully and properly given, it does not always show itself, and therefore we do not always have a high degree of Evidenz for phenomena. Much of Marion's language that seems so "excessive" perhaps blinds readers, including Gschwandtner, to his concern with what actually shows itself; and he is to be judged partly as a theorist of phenomenology (i.e., by the rigor and clarity of his theory of saturation) and partly as a working phenomenologist (i.e., by the convincingness of his descriptions of painting, prayer, love, sacrament, and so on). Each phenomenologist must respect the region of being in which a phenomenon gives itself, which means that one must take care not to look for high degrees of Evidenz where none could be found. The believer who, when praying -- even praying before the Eucharist -- claims to see Christ in a robust sense of the verb is more likely to be nuts than blessed. For Christ does not usually give himself to be seen in that manner, although a Catholic will surely say that Christ gives himself absolutely in the Eucharist. God gives himself in and through faith, we say, and phenomenologists need to distinguish faith more persistently from a watery sort of knowledge.

Like many phenomenologists, Marion is led more by theoretical insight than by close attention to phenomena, so we hear more about givenness than about showing. (It is the opposite with great artists: they are not always the most rigorous phenomenologists, relying on their empirical psychology, but they are seldom seduced by the blandishments of theory.) When Marion speaks of love in The Erotic Phenomenon (2003) he must do so by way of reduction -- indeed, a highly creative mode of reduction, one based on loving rather than the cogito -- in order to yield the self-givenness of eros. But how rarely that self-givenness is actually seen among lovers! Gschwandtner objects that Marion posits a perfect self-emptying love that is seldom realized (116). She reminds me of the narrator of Barchester Towers (1857) when he exclaims with stout British common sense, "How many shades there are between love and indifference, and how little the graduated scale is understood!"[17] Quite so; yet none of that love, no matter in what degree, could show itself (in words, touches, glances, sighs, acts) unless it had first been given. And Marion's point, I take it, is that the love that gives itself scarcely shows itself in the world but that it must be self-given to know what love is in the first place. All too often the lover merely sees (or, as Marion says, pre-sees) the beloved and does not let the beloved appear in any degree of intensity, let alone with full intensity. The great lover would be the one who does not resist the self-givenness of love, of love giving itself in all available modes -- anticipation, recollection, phantasy, feeling, cognition, perception, and so on -- without the filter of intentionality editing out what can manifest itself in the world. This is perhaps why Marion thinks of God (rather than Cassanova or Don Juan, say) as the greatest lover. Doubtless He is, yet, to my mind, the same claim can be made without endorsing Marion's univocal understanding of love.

One virtue of Degrees of Givenness is that its author puts pressure on Marion and his readers to find areas where he has not (or not yet) cast his gaze and areas where his analyses have been limited by his own philosophical formation or his pre-philosophical dispositions. For Gschwandtner, three of Marion's most significant gaps are a slighting of hermeneutics (raised in the introduction), an overlooking of nature (discussed in chapter three) and a lack of due acknowledgment of community (noted in chapter seven). Criticisms from the hermeneutical viewpoint can be met, partly by way of understanding the full range of the modes of being and the play of presence and absence and partly by way of a fuller account than Marion offers of the phenomenon of anticipation.[18] There is no doubt a lot of space in which to develop contemporary phenomenology, including Marion's version of it, in the sphere of nature (and, indeed, with respect to ecological concerns), and Gschwandtner is already a voice in this conversation. There has been no sign thus far that Marion will extend his work into this area. Certainly, there is little by way of community in Marion's writings, apart, that is, from his Cartesian emphasis on the cogito being always and already in dialog with God and with what Maurice Blanchot calls "the community of lovers."[19] Husserl thought that the individual subject was leagued to the transcendental community, and his explorations of this claim -- including reflections on the inter-subjective reduction -- are found in the three volumes of his phenomenology of inter-subjectivity.[20] Of course, since Marion rejects the human being as "subject" in his doctrine of l'adonné he cannot, strictly speaking, elaborate a theory of inter-subjectivity. Yet there is room for thinking the plurality of les adonnés, and this is a project that he has commenced only recently and informally in lectures and that remains in its infancy.

One would not read Degrees of Givenness in order to grasp the depths or the nuances of Marion's creative uses of Husserl and Heidegger: Gschwandtner does not present herself as a historian of phenomenology or seek to evaluate Marion's contributions to theory of reduction, modes of being, or the extent of phenomenality, for example. Her Marion is a contemporary, someone who has surprised many folk in European philosophy by suddenly insisting on the primacy of Gegebenheit and seeming to insist too heavily on it. I do not doubt that there are significant moments in Marion's work where his drive to present his view of things in a single-minded manner results in a blurring of what gives itself and what shows itself or that at times he is drawn to use a language marked by violence, and Gschwandtner is quite right to express perplexity when she encounters these moments. Perhaps, though, we are in need of another book, one entitled Degrees of Givenness and Showing.

[1] See Jean-Luc Marion, Being Given: Toward a Phenomenology of Givenness, trans. Jeffrey L. Kosky (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2002).

[2] See Marion, Reduction and Givenness: Investigations of Husserl, Heidegger, and Phenomenology, trans. Thomas A. Carlson (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1998).

[3] Marion's Gifford lectures are forthcoming in English translation with Oxford University Press, and Marion is currently revising the original French versions for a more detailed book on the same topic to come out in France. I should add, for the sake of clarity, that Marion does not suppose that there is a single or simple sense of "revelation" in the Judeo-Christian tradition; indeed, the very word "revelation" is a comparatively latecomer in that tradition.

[4] For a more detailed account of Marion's philosophical and theological views, see the introduction to my edition of his work in English translation, Jean-Luc Marion, The Essential Writings (New York: Fordham University Press, 2013), 1-38.

[5] See, for example, Marion, Ce que nous voyons et ce qui apparaît, overture de François Soulages (Bry-sur-Marne: INA Éditions, 2015), 32.

[6] See Christina M. Gschwandtner, Reading Jean-Luc Marion: Exceeding Metaphysics (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2007) and Postmodern Apologetics? Arguments for God in Contemporary Philosophy (New York: Fordham University Press, 2012). Gschwandtner has translated Marion's On the Ego and on God (New York: Fordham University Press, 2007) and The Visible and the Revealed (New York: Fordham University Press, 2008).

[7] Wallace Stevens, "The Auroras of Autumn," Collected Poetry and Prose, ed. Frank Kermode and Joan Richardson (New York: The Library of America, 1997), 356.

[8] See Marion, God without Being: Hors-Texte, trans. Thomas A. Carlson (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1991). In French the title also suggests "God without being God" and, by way of homophone (and with a sideways glance to Derrida), "God without text."

[9] Yet see Marion's Givenness and Hermeneutics, trans. Jean-Pierre Lafouge (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2013). Marion is currently extending his case in this lecture, the result of which will appear in a forthcoming book in French.

[10] In fact Marion develops reduction in two directions: by way of the "third reduction" and by way of the "erotic reduction." See Reduction and Givenness, 192-98, and The Erotic Phenomenon, trans. Stephen Lewis (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006), § 3.

[11] See Eugen Fink, Sixth Cartesian Meditation: The Idea of a Transcendental Theory of Method with Textual Notations by Edmund Husserl, trans. and intro. Ronald Bruzina (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995), esp. 149.

[12] See Husserl, The Idea of Phenomenology, trans. William P. Alston and George Nakhikian, intro. George Nakhnikian (The Hague: Martinus Nijoff, 1973), and Thing and Space: Lectures 1907, ed. Ulrich Claesges (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973).

[13] See Stevens, "Mrs Alfred Uruguay," Collected Poems and Prose, 226.

[14] See Marion, Being Given, 16.

[15] These questions strike me as very substantial indeed. Husserl distinguishes several modes of reduction in the second volume of his Erste Philosophie, although, to be sure, the phenomenological reduction remained his constant focus. He held that the experienced phenomenologist can remain in the reduction. Following Heidegger, Marion links reduction to mood and in doing so cuts himself from something significant in Husserl's work, namely switching from one attitude to another.

[16] See Marion, Being Given, 178. Gschwandtner is alert to this caveat in Marion. See Degrees of Givenness, 5.

[17] Anthony Trollope, Barchester Towers, text established by Robin Gilmour (Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1982), 211.

[18] For some concrete examples, see my Poetry and Revelation (London: Bloomsbury, 2016).

[19] See Maurice Blanchot, The Unavowable Community, trans. Pierre Joris (Barrytown, NY: Station Hill Press, 2006), Part II.

[20] See Husserl, Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivät, 3 vols, ed. Iso Kern (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973). Marion edits the series, Epiméthée, for PUF in which one can find a partial French translation of the German text, Sur l'intersubjectivité, 2 vols, 2nd ed. (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2011).