Deleuze and Art

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Anne Sauvagnargues, Deleuze and Art, Samantha Bankston (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2013, 228pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441173805.

Reviewed by Gary Genosko, University of Ontario Institute of Technology


Art is an encounter and an occasion for experimentation, and for Anne Sauvagnargues Deleuze's thinking about art may be studied through the deployment of periodization. But this is neither mere chronology nor historical evolution; it is certainly not art history. Rather, it is a question of sketching challenges, itineraries, and conceptual transformations. It is like a "stretching exercise," Sauvagnargues suggests, in which periodization yields three plateaus or "states of variation" of the question of art within the non-static Deleuzian system of thought: the stage of literature, critique of interpretation and semioisis, and then the image, affect and percept (4). Periodization as a method is not subjected to a critique based upon the ample resources available from multiple disciplines, especially history. This might pose a problem were it not for the fact that Deleuze himself concurred with this periodized map.

The first stage is populated by Proust, Kafka, Sacher-Masoch, Carmelo Bene, and Beckett. The second is less a shopping list of authors than the result of a "decisive" encounter with Deleuze's collaborator Félix Guattari that reorganizes his philosophy around collective and political issues, and is marked by the emergence of the theory of assemblages, rhizomatics, and a dynamic conception of signs beyond structural linguistics. Literature's primacy is displaced by the critique of interpretation. And then, the nondiscursive stage: Francis Bacon, Baroque art, and cinema.

Sauvagnargues mounts a "dynamic reading" of clinical experimentation in art beginning with literary creativity in Sacher-Masoch. Deleuze's attention to stylistic matters in Masochism frees the creatively anomalous elements of masochism from the stranglehold of its coupling with sadism. Literary assessment of symptomatology in Sacher-Masoch (masochism), Proust (homosexuality), Artaud (schizophrenia), and Kafka (bureaucracy) shifts onto forces, which art captures, and artists operate upon signs understood affectively. Deleuze's materialist semiotics delivers semiosis from interpretation in favour of art as material force relations. Art makes the hitherto imperceptible perceptible, and it is critically evaluated through the open classification of signs and images and the mapping of affects. Here we see the convergence of the Nietzschean (relations of forces) and Spinozan (ethology) lines of influence in Deleuzean thought; Bergson will appear shortly thereafter through non-representational images (movements of matter).

Elegantly parsing Deleuze's distinctions between the major contribution of Artaud, and lesser inventions of Lewis Carroll and Louis Wolfson, Sauvagnargues investigates how literature grants "access" to the intensive, nonorganic plane below organization, through poetic disarticulation, agrammaticality, and disintegration. Simondon's contribution of modulation and the critique of hylomorpism are aligned with art's replacement of form-matter with force-matter relations, squarely concerned with real becomings.

As a sophisticated reader of Guattari, Sauvagnargues insightfully insists on his role in injecting themes of desire and power into the "heart" of Deleuze's philosophy of art. She cites the concept of transversality as putting an end to lingering attachments to interpretation in Deleuze's thinking of literature, eventually replaced by experimentation; manifested in the second edition of Proust, fully on display in Kafka as what comes after interpretation, and formalized in Rhizome. The role of the machinic, within and beyond literary analysis, is the switching point of Deleuze's focus on discourse to the non-discursive, and the literary and then desiring machine ("machined" by social production), de-subjectifies the personal unconscious, as a theatre of representation staging ahistorical dramas, requiring the critique of Oedipus, and other master signifiers and registers of psychoanalysis, as instruments that wield power and contain the unconscious. The touchpoints of Guattari's and Foucault's theories are crisply displayed.

Sauvagnargues sets for herself the task of inlaying the theory of subjectivation into the explication of the critical dimensions of Deleuze's philosophy of art. Turning to minoration and the treatment of language as continuous variation, the primacy of variable, intensive, linguistic becoming, and the sobriety of style (underlining "dryness"), contextualize the depersonalization that displaces the author-subject as an individual for the sake of collective enunciation. Thus, art can gain access to an "impersonal and singular mode" in the wake of the organization it dissolves: dismantling molar formations and liberating molecular forces. This is astutely illustrated by the figure of the artist as 'bachelor machine': a genius-creator like Kafka, Artaud, or Duchamp is dissolved into a solitary, non-personal singularity. The bachelor's 'extra-conjugal marriage' is unnnatural because his encounter is on the order of the wasp and orchid: disjunctive, a-parallel, non-totalizable becoming. Gender does not figure in this analysis, and the contempt with which conjugality was held by Deleuze survives intact. Art mixes together the three main lines of rhizomes: molar lines are crossed and punctured by molecular lines as the line of flight provides an escape route for deterritorialized codes from strata and hard formations. This mixing ensures that art, in creating becomings (intense, animal, imperceptible), eludes the strata (organization, signifier, subjectivity).

In all its multi-mediatic diversity, art seizes haecceities arising from the imperceptible and maps them. From the perspective of periodization, Sauvagnargues aligns the replacement of desire with the theory of the haecceity and, "desire moves into perception" (134). The shift from Anti-Oedipus to The Fold and What is Philosophy? is massive, with A Thousand Plateaus already expressing ambivalence about desire (not to mention schizoanalysis, which becomes stratoanalysis in the joint works and is left for Guattari to pursue separately).

Although Sauvagnargues does not provide artist case studies as such, she devotes a few richly in-depth pages to both Henri Michaux and Bacon; the former painter-poet opening us to intercultural aesthetic experience via Chinese poem-drawing rather than through the less favorable trees of French literature and grasses of American literature, the latter much beloved by Deleuze. Deleuze highly respected Michaux's artistic experiments in writing and painting with "impersonal individuation and the event of the haecceity" (137), even accepting the use of mescaline, not for its own sake, but for the rhizomatic perceptions it "aroused" and "accelerated." The artist then needed to hang the haecceities on something, rendering them perceptible. Sauvagnargues walks a fine line here, carefully bringing Deleuze's antipathy toward drug culture into highly qualified praise for Michaux's mescaline experiments, going to a tautly worded edge in explaining that "drugs can help catalyze a sober moderation for phenomena which they did not produce." When it comes to Bacon's painting of sensation, the emphasis is on the violence of forces (deformations of the body) and how Deleuze presents the pictorial elements and movements that reach beyond the figurative (representation or illustration) in favor of the figural (capture of an intensive movement that produces a shock). Akin to Michaux's kinship with the nonhuman, Bacon's intensive, animal-becomings deform the human (his screaming popes).

Deleuze's theory of becoming is described by Sauvagnargues in a number of ways: it surpasses metaphor (there are different stages of this critique, from Kafka to The Time-Image), analogical mimesis, and hermeneutic interpretation. Art is conceived of in terms of immanence, and thought in terms of becomings. Regaining her earlier remarks on interculturalism, Sauvagnargues takes the example of Chinese painting a step further, describing how Deleuze found it rich in the capture of the force relations of haecceities and intensive becomings, and his recourse to this example in his study of Bacon (the force of empty spaces and "colored voids") is expertly wrought in a few nuanced pages. The role ("relative importance") of Oriental art in Deleuze is couched in a number of astute qualifications (specifically around nations and the distortion of their characteristics as "superior", and in the many "absences" of national cinemas in Deleuze's film philosophy) so as not to overstate the case. After all, the point is to create concepts and develop theory, and his preferences for certain literature and painting are "provisional relay[s]" and not "prescriptions" (163).

Yet these issues bleed into the discussion of the two film books, since their tensions are carried over into the explication of Deleuze's shift from prewar (movement-image) to postwar cinemas (time-image) and misreadings of this succession as historical progress; and the coexistence and consolidation of the actual and virtual in the cinematic image, mistaken as an unambiguous assertion of the virtual's superiority. The passage from motor reactions and sensory affects (rupturing action on and then reinventing relations with the world) to the "crystal-image", clearing the way through the dissolution of cliché to the experience of the image's "inchoate potentialities", helps articulate creativity's constant struggle with cliché, which is in play before the paint hits the canvas.

At this juncture it is appropriate to reach this topic, as creativity is the final and fourth plateau of the stage's of Deleuze's thought; the third was ethology of culture; the second concerned Guattari's socio-political interventions; and the first was the intensive sign. For Sauvagnargues, periodization is "pragmatic" and more about "thresholds" (of constitution, ramification, dissipation, and external rhizomatics) and how concepts become. Periods keep moving. Other potential periods crowd around. Deleuze's own "referential complexes" bring authors together to solve distinct problems, and Sauvagnargues' work of referencing does much the same. This is why the book consists only of short sections that simplify and remain "indicative." No extended analyses are offered.

What is the place of the book in the critical literature? English readers with an interest in music will be disappointed (there are no references to Bogue's studies). Likewise, there is little about theatre and performance (no citations of Cull or Reynolds); the debates on the new initiated by Zepke and O'Sullivan find no place. A good translation deserves some recontextualization for its new reception.

The conclusion is a bit abrupt and doesn't really investigate the big questions it rushes past: situating experimentation in the romantic-avant-garde-Deleuze trajectory is left unexamined; is Deleuze's aesthetics of effects only a pretext in the end for a philosophical semiotic typology realized in the cinema books? And if the philosophy of signs is so vitally important for Deleuze, why is there no mention of the Peircean semiotics he adopts and adapts? Kant barely registers.

Sauvagnargues seems a bit resigned to the limits of periodization ("sufficient determination for the semiotic concepts" (176)), and while she doesn't ask too many hard questions about it, her concluding endorsements of its relativeness -- conveying tensions as Deleuze's thought changed, quite attentive to its potentially productive variations -- while perfectly Deleuzean, are not exactly ringing endorsements. Of course, too strong an attachment might push periodization over the edge into transcendent categories, and objective determinations would be counterproductive, and beside the point. In the end, readers will be impressed with Sauvagnargues' masterful grasp of Deleuze's entire oeuvre, and admire her tightly argued claims about how his aesthetics is based in empirical experimentation with material and social effects and real consequences for processes of subjectivation.