Deleuze and Derrida: Difference and the Power of the Negative

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Vernon W. Cisney, Deleuze and Derrida: Difference and the Power of the Negative, Edinburgh University Press, 2018, 305pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748696222.

Reviewed by Bruce Baugh, Thompson Rivers University


What remains for us now of Hegel, Gilles Deleuze, Jacques Derrida and the "philosophy of difference"? In the 1980s, as more and more works by Derrida and Deleuze were translated into English, difference -- or différance, to use Derrida's neologism -- was all the rage in Continental philosophy. As Vernon W. Cisney's book argues, although the names of Derrida and Deleuze were often linked as philosophers of difference, there are important differences between them. Thirty years on, this point has been made often enough that it will be familiar to anyone who has been following this topic, and Cisney's book does not offer much that is new. Yet, this volume usefully summarizes the main points of contrast between what Cisney calls Deleuze's "constructivism" and Derrida's "deconstruction."

The basic point of contrast is between Deleuze's relational and affirmative differential ontology and Derrida's negative differential ontology, or between Derrida's "Hegelianism without reserve," in which the negative is so negative that it cannot even be dialectically recuperated as negative, and Deleuze's rejection of merely negative difference and opposition as being merely derivative of a primary affirmative difference. Both Derrida and Deleuze reject Hegel's Aufhebung, in which oppositions are overcome in a higher synthesis, but for different reasons. Derrida does not want conflict and negation to be cancelled out through dialectical mediation, and Deleuze rejects the entire apparatus of "the negation of the negation" as missing the affirmative "difference in itself" of differing forces and intensities entering into combinations that are not necessarily antagonistic.

Cisney's method is to provide background by going through the history of "difference" in philosophy from Heraclitus to Heidegger (chapter 2), and then to focus on Derrida and Deleuze's differing relations to Hegel on difference (chapters 3 through 5) before finally coming to deal with Derrida's and Deleuze's own philosophies of difference through Derrida's concepts of the trace and différance and Deleuze's concepts of intensities, becoming and the simulacrum (chapters 6 through 8). A final contrast includes a consideration of the differing relations between Derrida and Deleuze's philosophies and feminism (chapters 9 and 10). These final chapters are in many ways the most interesting and original and could have been developed more.

Chapter 2, on the history of discussions of difference from Heraclitus to Heidegger, is by and large fairly elementary, and apart from an interesting discussion of the Same and the Different in Plato's Sophist -- unfortunately, never taken up later in the discussion of Hegel's analysis of difference in the Science of Logic -- is too brief and schematic to be of much interest. Things pick up when Cisney gets to Heidegger's discussions of Nietzsche (46-54), particularly Heidegger's contention that Nietzsche's reversal of Plato, in placing Becoming over Being, retains the onto-theological notion of Being as presence and as a constant (creation-destruction) underlying the changes in particular beings. Whether and how Platonism can be "overturned" is a matter Cisney returns to in his discussions of Deleuze's notion of the "simulacrum" (166-170) and Derrida's contention that Nietzsche is not an ontologist at all, but a "strategist of writing" (150-54). Nietzsche and Heidegger are both key figures for Deleuze's and Derrida's philosophies of difference, although Cisney does not sufficiently underline that Nietzsche counts far more for Deleuze than for Derrida, just as Heidegger counts far more for Derrida than for Deleuze.

The end of chapter 2 also presents a problem that Cisney comes back to again and again: whether Derrida and Deleuze are "transcendental philosophers" who seek to provide the grounds or fundamental conditions that make possible such things as identity and contradiction, and so retain "a kernel of identity or the universal" insofar as the "genetic conditions" must be universal principles (59). Although Cisney later notes that an ontological ground need not be a stable, present substance (218), his position seems to fly in the face of Derrida and Deleuze's contentions that the "ground" of Being and différance is more of an abyss, an Abgrund that does not have the stability and rigid boundaries of Plato's Forms or any other principle that would enable this ground to found or legitimate either knowledge claims or moral claims. Deleuze's "field of immanence" (which Cisney does not discuss) and Derrida's différance, are certainly not "foundations" in the sense of the "unshakeable fundament" on which philosophers such as Descartes and Husserl wanted to erect the edifice of knowledge. Cisney notes that Derrida is quite explicit that although the undecidability linked to différance is what makes free moral decisions both possible and morally necessary, this same undecidability is also what prevents such decisions from ever achieving any certain and unquestionable justification (see 158, 256-61). A moving, fluid and uncertain ontological ground, then, or Derrida's mise en abîme (an infinite regress of grounds), is not the same as a "foundation" as that term has been understood in the history of Western philosophy.

Chapters 3 and 4 deal with Derrida and Deleuze's critical engagements with Hegel. Chapter 3, on Derrida, rightly argues that Derrida is not anti-Hegelian. Derrida sees any anti-Hegelianism as being relative to Hegel's system and so determined by that system. Cisney focuses here on Derrida's essays on Levinas, "Violence and Metaphysics," and on Foucault, "Cogito and the History of Madness" (both from 1964), ignoring for the time being Derrida's most important early essay on Hegel, "From Restricted to General Economy: For a Hegelianism Without Reserve," although this last is the one containing what Cisney takes to be Derrida's key point that Hegelian negativity is not sufficiently negative (see 122).

Strangely, despite the vast amounts of ink spilled regarding Derrida's essays on Foucault and Levinas, Cisney does not refer to any of the secondary literature, but simply summarizes Derrida's arguments. Equally strangely, Cisney does not refer to any of Hegel's discussions of language and experience, such as the "Sense-Certainty" chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit, to uncover the source of Derrida's reasoning that Foucault's or Levinas' "empiricism" cannot put into language what it means to say. Instead, he moves on to Heidegger's contention that Hegel's Spirit, despite its incorporation of difference within itself, is still caught up in the "self-presence" that is the determinative meaning of Being in the tradition of Western metaphysics (82-89). Cisney mostly recapitulates Derrida's arguments without subjecting them to critical analysis. When he returns to Derrida's relation to Hegel's thought repeatedly in what follows, he does so mostly on the basis of Derrida's early texts (Voice and Phenomena, Of Grammatology and Writing and Difference, all from 1967), neglecting later texts such as Glas (1974) and The Truth in Painting (1978), let alone Specters of Marx (1993). Cisney's emphasis on différance and the trace is certainly legitimate, but gives his reading of Derrida a certain one-sidedness.

The following chapter on Deleuze and Hegel does somewhat better, although it too relies too much on very early texts such as Nietzsche and Philosophy (1962). Cisney defends Deleuze from critics such as Catherine Malabou who argue that Deleuze's conception of Hegel's philosophy is not sharply delineated. He points to Deleuze's reliance on Bergson's contention that contradiction and opposition arise only at the level of "the actual" that results from the actualization of differing tendencies that are in tension with each other but without opposition (98-99). Cisney provides a clear and insightful account on Deleuze's use of Nietzsche against Hegel, especially on ressentiment and active and reactive forces (99-105), winding up with Deleuze's key argument in Difference and Repetition that contradiction and opposition presuppose given and stable identities that make the Self/Not-Self and Same/Other relations possible, and so subordinate difference to identity.

Although chapters 3 and 4 nicely set up the rest of the book, Cisney does not provide any historical context for why, beginning around 1962, French philosophers suddenly started talking about "difference" and why this apparently abstract problem became so important. Hyppolite's influence is acknowledged, but otherwise, the developments in French philosophy and society that got people so worked up about what on the surface looks like a question of metaphysical logic are passed over in silence.

With chapter 5, the differences between Derrida and Deleuze regarding Hegelian negativity come into focus. Derrida's strategy is to "dislocate" hierarchical oppositions within systems in a way that liberates the dominated or subordinate term (121), whereas Deleuze disagrees with the negative and oppositional conception of difference, arguing that the tension between forces or tendencies is not necessarily conflictual (124, 204). Cisney has a tendency to make Deleuzian difference into the "peaceful coexistence" of differences that Deleuze associates with Hegel's "beautiful soul," ignoring the sometimes aggressive nature of difference that Deleuze draws from both Marx and Nietzsche.

Chapters 6 though 8, on "difference in itself," are the true heart of the book, and again are mostly expository. Chapter 6 deals with différance and the trace in Derrida, arguing that both of these involve origins that are not full presences but temporally dispersed constitutive non-presences, or a "nothing" that makes possible binary oppositions while at the same time destabilizing them (134, 142, 157-58). Cisney grounds Derrida's account of différance as both temporal delay and a "spacing" between terms in Derrida's Voice and Phenomena, and while his exegesis of Derrida's critique of Husserl is well done (it was also the subject of a 2014 book by Cisney), it could have been abbreviated. The sections on Derrida's treatment of Freud on the trace, in which Derrida argues that every trace is constituted by the possibility of its erasure (143-49), and on Derrida on Nietzsche as a non-ontological strategist of writing whose emphasis on metaphor and metonymy liberated the signifier (150-54), likewise get a bit lost in the details. Cisney's main point is that the terms in any system possess no identity in themselves but are determined through what they are not (157). He does not draw a link between this contention and Saussure's definition of language as a system of differences without positive terms or to Hegel's Science of Logic, but instead emphasizes that "the trace is but a trace of other traces," the remains of a vanishing that points to its own future disappearance. In his conclusion, Cisney rightly emphasizes this metaphysics of finitude in Derrida (see 265-66), noting that Deleuze would regard this preoccupation with death as nihilistic (267).

The following chapter on Deleuze's difference suffers from a lack of unity. It begins with a discussion of Deleuze on the simulacrum: the image that does not resemble the model in the way that a copy does, but instead "negates the original and the copy" (169). Cisney later quotes Deleuze saying that he abandoned the theory of the simulacrum as "all but worthless" (227), and gives no clear explanation of why he needed to discuss it. Cisney then takes up an entirely different line of argument, contrasting Aristotle's analogical conception of Being to Deleuze's theory of the univocity of Being (170-180), concluding with Deleuze's thesis that a univocal theory of Being conceives beings with respect to whether a being is able to transcend its limits by going to the limits of what it can do. Deleuze's startling synthesis of Nietzsche's self-overcoming with Spinoza's conatus is not further commented on; instead, Cisney turns to "the eternal return" (180-191), bringing together texts from Nietzsche and Philosophy, The Logic of Sense and Difference and Repetition to explain how identity arises from the repetition of difference. He emphasizes Deleuze's contention that intensities are differences in themselves that relate to all other intensities in a field or system, such that in affirming itself, each intensity affirms all the others. Much of this is more summary than explanation, and is sometimes quite opaque.

Chapter 8, comparing Derrida and Deleuze, summarizes the previous two chapters without adding anything new. In chapter 9, though, things get interesting. For one, Cisney has to argue, against Derrida, that Derrida is doing ontology (Deleuze, by contrast, declares that "philosophy must be ontology"), and argues that the only reason Derrida insists that he is not doing ontology is because he conceives of ontology as an ontology of presence (213-14, 231). Although Derrida says that we cannot call différance a ground, it is nevertheless an origin of differences, and so functions as a non-substantial, non-present condition of what exists: an ontological ground (218). Cisney is less persuasive when he argues that Derrida thinks exclusively in terms of binary oppositions (213-14, 273) despite Derrida's claims that the trace both escapes binarism and makes it possible (273). In later texts (Glas, The Truth in Painting), Derrida breaks up the monogamous pairings of terms and argues for a more promiscuous proliferation of relations (those texts do belong to the 1970s, after all). Another long exposition of Husserl's 1905 theory of time (220-225) could have usefully been contrasted with a Deleuzian-Bergsonian theory of time, but is not.

Only in the conclusion does Cisney move into new territory, beginning with "double affirmation" in Derrida and Deleuze. For Derrida, the "archi-originary 'yes'" or "originary affirmation" is "in its structure" a response that presupposes a prior address to the respondent, and likewise points forward to the possibility of a further response: either a reaffirmation (yes) or a betrayal (no), with death and radical evil being the ultimate negative responses risked by the first, promissory affirmation (249-52). Cisney contrasts this with Deleuze's double affirmation of Dionysus-Ariadne: Dionysus as the affirmation of becoming, and Ariadne as the respondent "affirmation of affirmation" (255). Cisney links this contrast between "the Deleuzian yes that transfigures woe and the Derridean yes that celebrates woe as woe" (272) to a discussion of responsibility and ethics: Derrida's archi-originary 'yes' is, says Elizabeth Grosz, "the active movement of tearing, cutting, breaking apart" -- a déchirement that is intimately connected to vulnerability and sites of oppression (273-75). Deleuze allegedly "obliterates" sites of oppression (and of resistance) in the flow of molecular becoming that undoes all identities and subject-positions, a disservice to women at a time when they are fighting for recognition as subjects. This is related to the point that, unlike Derrida and Levinas, Deleuze's thought is not oriented "by the responsibility in the face of radical alterity" (269-72).

That is true in one sense -- Deleuze rejects identity-politics along with identity, together with the whole moral machinery of guilt-responsibility-debt-sacrifice-bad conscience; but false in another -- Deleuze proposes an ethics that he contrasts with morality and that involves becoming-active, becoming-minoritarian, becoming-revolutionary, a project that seeks the liberation of others as correlative to going to the limits of what one can do, one based on generosity rather than debt. Many feminists have taken inspiration from Deleuze (Rosi Braidotti, Claire Colebrook and Grosz, among others), but there is no hint of that in Cisney's book.

When all is said and done, then, what remains to us today of a Derrida, a Deleuze, a Hegel? Much, and the polemical conclusion of Cisney's book reminds us of how much work has yet to be done in order to unearth it.