Deleuze and Ethics

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Nathan Jun and Daniel W. Smith (eds.), Deleuze and Ethics, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 222pp., $37.50 (pbk), ISBN 978074864116.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Although Deleuze's philosophical work covered a remarkably wide range of subjects, the secondary literature on him has not been equally distributed; while his metaphysics and his aesthetics have each received substantial attention, his practical philosophy has been treated comparatively sparingly. This collection of eleven essays, many from notable Deleuze scholars, seeks to remedy this relative neglect, and succeeds in laying out the major themes of the field as well as indicating a number of avenues for future research. It should be noted that the book is for Deleuze specialists, or at most for continental philosophy readers. Some points of potential intersection with analytic ethics are hinted at, and will be addressed in this review, but this is not a crossover book.

A passable definition of practical philosophy is the reflection on ethics, morality, and politics. While ethics and politics are related in complex ways for Deleuze -- some of which are treated in the contributions by Jeffrey Bell, Levi Bryant, Erinn Cunniff Gilson, Nathan Jun, and Audronė Žukauskaitė -- the distinction between morality and ethics was fundamental and binary. Morality, understood as the application of a transcendent standard to a case, was seen as a false step, something to be avoided and gotten rid of -- "to be done with judgment" was one of Deleuze's wishes. Following a Spinozist and Nietzschean line, ethics is understood as the immanent evaluation of an encounter of bodies; what is evaluated is the affective dimension of the encounter, the changes in the composition of the bodies and the concomitant change in the power of the bodies, a change felt as joy or sadness, depending on the valence of the change.

The essays in this book all depend upon, and many develop, the implications of this distinction between morality and ethics. The two major interlocutors proposed by the authors are the ones already adduced, those whom readers of Deleuze have come to expect: Spinoza and Nietzsche. Welcome additions to that duo are Artaud, Badiou, Bergson, Blanchot, Foucault, Lacan, and even Leibniz. The Deleuze and feminism connection is also ably handled by Gilson.

Instead of organizing this review by sequentially treating each essay, I will highlight three themes that recur across the essays. The first two are familiar to even casual readers of Deleuze: the productive ontological and the experiential; the third, which we can call the "static ontological," is less well-known but receives welcome attention in two of the essays.

First, let us examine the productive ontological theme by which (subjective and institutional, but also physical and biological) identities are produced as the resolution of a differential or "problematic" field. This differential production licenses the critique of a "tracing" relation that posits transcendental identities as grounds of empirical ones. Among the essays to consider under this rubric are the ones by Bell, Bryant, Gilson, Jun, Daniel W. Smith, and Žukauskaitė. Let us consider the Bryant and Jun essays as exemplifying this theme.

Bryant focuses on the distinction between pre-set "dilemmas" with a closed set of pre-given answers and true open-ended "problems," those resting on a differential field of social forces in tension with one another, such that any intervention into the situation (or "assemblage" to use the technical term) will change the conditions for future interventions. Problems thus arise and persist in response to the introduction of novel elements in an assemblage; Bryant exemplifies this with a case study of the introduction of Texas legislation concerning vaccination against HPV (human papillomavirus). Bryant's treatment resonates with Latour's notions of actants and with Badiou's notion of the unforeseen, what isn't countable as part of the assemblage. In addition to these continental references, a confrontation with the mainstream use of Trolley Problems (which would precisely not be "problems" in the Deleuzean sense) would have been useful here, but I do recognize word count constraints and don't hold this missed opportunity as a fault of Bryant's essay.[1]

Jun lays out in what sense Deleuze can be said to tackle the question of political normativity. How does Deleuze reject morality as application of a law to a case and representation as isolating the identity-indicating properties of a subject or situation but still have normative standards? Jun formulates his answer via a critical discussion of Todd May, in the following manner. Deleuzean normativity must be categorical without being transcendental; it must be an immanent or "pragmatic" conception of normativity. Deleuzean normativity then "must (a) be self-reflexive and (b) its adoption must not inhibit the self-reflexivity of norms" (101). The technical Deleuzean term here is "absolute deterritorialization," which is "categorical, insofar as it applies to every possible norm as such, but it is not transcendent; rather it is immanent to whatever norms (and, by extension, assemblages) constitute it" (101).

The metaphysical resources for Jun's notion of Deleuzean normativity come from Deleuze's reading of Spinoza. If representation looks to the properties of existing, actual, static substances, Deleuze's Spinoza enables us to think substance as a virtual differential field from which individuation issues. Thus with regard to subjectivity, "every human being is both a product of a unique and complicated multiplicity of forces, including the inward-directed forces of self-creation, as well as a producer of difference, change, movement, and transformation" (103). Although I think the abstract term "forces" should be replaced by something like "bio-social subjectification practices," the singularity of human beings as unique resolutions of a differential field is clearly Jun's target:

Deleuze thinks every human being is the product of a unique and complicated multiplicity of forces. Consequently only individuals are in a position to discover, through processes of experimentation, what is valuable in their lives, what they ought to pursue and avoid, etc., in a particular set of circumstances (104-5).

Here, in addition to the Nietzschean and Spinozist heritage, I believe there is also a possible connection to the mainstream notion of moral particularism. In keeping with the practice of reviewing the book that is written rather than one that could have been written, however, let's simply note this as another crossover point between analytic and continental philosophy that can and should be pursued elsewhere.

A second theme is that of approaching the ethical register via the link between experience and experimentation in the French word expérience. Here we see Deleuze's insistence that we need a shock to thought, a violent encounter that jolts us out of our received cognitive-affective structures. The Deleuzoguattarian term here is the move from (Oedipalized) organism to a "Body without Organs." The essays that explore this theme are those of Laura Cull, Gilson, Kenneth Surin, and Anthony Uhlmann.

To exemplify this theme, let us consider Uhlmann's essay, "Deleuze, Ethics, Ethology and Art." Uhlmann joins the terms of his title together as those endeavors concerned with questions of living. The first resource here is Spinozist ethics, which tells us to join with that object that agrees with your nature (157). Ethology broadens the ethical register to study the linking of an animal's behavioral habits with its territory. Uhlmann then provides a concise reading of Bergson's Creative Evolution, following the thread of sympathy, and isolating the themes of vegetative torpor, animal instinct, human intelligence, and sympathetic intuition. Animal instinct is that which enables the use of body parts as tools to do a task; as such, it is organized thought employing knowledge of matter and so fits itself to moving reality (162). Intelligence, displayed by humans most of all, is organizing thought, that which allows the development of instruments. As such a knowledge of form, it fixes things in place, conceiving the living as if lifeless; it is thus incapable of fully grasping moving reality. Intuition requires that one have sympathy with world; it proceeds by feeling rather than by thought, in such a way that sympathetic intuition constitutes an aesthetic faculty that supplements normal perception.

With these concepts in mind, Uhlmann then connects the Deleuzoguattarian notion of haecceity or thisness with an ethology of the here and now (164). He can then come back to Spinoza and investigate the affects involved with assemblage formation; here the chain of thought connects essence with conatus with appetite. Desire is then appetite with consciousness of appetite. There follows a discussion of active and passive affects, distinguished by the requirement of understanding for active affect, so that increasing your power to act means acting in accord with your nature (167). After the Spinozist recapitulation, Uhlmann moves to consider the Deleuzoguattarian ethology of the refrain. Here, space becomes milieu when the world is translated from space into the matter of expression; for instance, birdsong is a signature whose meaning is the marking of a milieu. A milieu-marking signature is only the condition of possibility for art, but is not yet art, for art requires collectivity: "art emerges when the signature is transformed into style . . . generate affects which can in turn make others feel" (168). All the threads of this complex essay are woven together in the conclusion of the essay such that "art presents those relations that resonate in life, even though the terms of the actual relations (the bodies and minds) are absent." In this way "the artist . . . can generate sympathy by creating inter- and intra-relational resonance" (168). This essay teeters on the edge of a tour de force, but keeps its balance and rewards the reader with a very useful synthesis.

Finally, let us consider the emphasis by Eleanor Kaufman and James Williams on the static ontological, that overlooked emphasis by Deleuze on eternity, intemporality and death, an emphasis that runs counter to the received notion of Deleuze as a "postmodern" philosopher who always affirms flux, change, flow, novelty, and "life."[2] I will focus only on Kaufman's essay here.

Kaufman, in "Ethics and the World without Others," works out an "anethics," which is "stranger and darker" and thus "in resonance with Lacan as well as with a certain structuralist imperative" (108). Lacan asks "have you acted in conformity with the desire that is in you?" According to Kaufman, Deleuze twists this question into an implicit precept: we should act so as "to not give ground relative to that place where desire is stopped in its tracks" (109). Deleuze is said to be preoccupied "with those zones where desire if arrested, and more often than not arrested at that point where it resonates with a higher notion of structure itself" (109). In following this line, Kaufman finds a number of very interesting connections here, notably to Blanchot, who posits "a being of pure inertia and immobility" that "surpasses even the intemporality of Deleuze's Aion" (110).[3] Blanchot's stasis is "an endless present that marks a radical dwelling in being that in no way resembles the parousia of being or presence that is often under assault by Jacques Derrida and others" (110).

Now although Kaufman argues that Blanchot outdoes Deleuze in affirming a static being, she will go on to highlight the underplayed Deleuzean concepts that do not accord with the received notion of Deleuze as a philosopher of flux, flow, and change, but is instead interested in zones of arrested desire. The zones are those elucidated by Deleuze's "concepts of sadism, the world without others, the third synthesis of time, and the death instinct." Kaufman proposes that these concepts "all mirror each other and reveal not only an extreme formalism but an extreme state of stasis and non-becoming at the heart of Deleuze's early work" (109).

After excellent readings of the interlocking concepts, Kaufman concludes with a reference to "the extreme state of negation, death, purity, sadism, intemporality, incorporeality" as the "hidden kernel of Deleuze's philosophical project . . . not so clearly visible from the vantage point of the later work or the joint work with Guattari." This is indeed a strong claim, and I'm not so sure about "kernel" as that seems to have a germinal connotation, as if the ontological and experimentalist ethics the other essays treat have sprung from this conceptual nexus oriented to stasis. I'm certainly not in favor of a naïve "postmodernist" reading of Deleuze as philosopher of flow and flux, but neither do I want to posit stasis as the (germinal) kernel for all Deleuzean ethics. Nonetheless, Kaufman's essay is well worth the effort in following as she unfolds the way in which Deleuze also contains "an ethics of relation, if not to others then to the forces of the impersonal, the law, and structure itself" (119). Here we see the final potential connection to mainstream concerns: working out the relation of Deleuze to law and morality. Broached in this volume by Kaufman and Jun, it would provide fertile ground for sustained reflection.[4]

[1] Readers interested in such a confrontation could consult James Williams's essay on Deleuze and Gilbert Harman in The Transversal Thought of Gilles Deleuze: Encounters and Influences (Manchester: Clinamen, 2005).

[2] This emphasis echoes the challenge posed by Claire Colebrook to the "life-affirming" readings of Deleuze in her recent Deleuze and the Meaning of Life (London: Continuum, 2010).

[3] In Logic of Sense Deleuze distinguishes Aion, a future-past that is never present, and Chronos, a succession of present moments.

[4] Alexandre Lefebvre has a book-length study of Deleuze and law, The Image of Law: Deleuze, Bergson, Spinoza (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008), as does Laurent de Suter,Deleuze. La pratique du droit (Paris: Éditions Michalon, 2009).