Deleuze and Guattari's A Thousand Plateaus: A Critical Introduction and Guide

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Brent Adkins, Deleuze and Guattari's A Thousand Plateaus: A Critical Introduction and Guide, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 265pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748686469.

Reviewed by Dorothea E. Olkowski, University of Colorado, Colorado Springs


The recent spread of interest in the philosophical project of Gilles Deleuze and FĂ©lix Guattari has influenced scholars to produce new materials that clarify the ideas and aims of Deleuze and Guattari's shared endeavor. Given the breadth and originality of their work, the task is challenging. It requires a thorough understanding of their philosophical orientation and the ability to decipher complex concepts and structures. Brent Adkins' recent contribution manages to carry out both of these tasks admirably.

Adkins begins by circumscribing A Thousand Plateaus in terms of the distinction between continuity and discontinuity, especially in the relation between the sensible and the intelligible which, for Deleuze and Guattari, are not related to one another as content and form. That is, they are not different in kind but differ only in degree. Thus, Being is said to be univocal, to speak with one voice (2). Adkins argues that the continuity of the sensible and intelligible is found across the work of Deleuze and that he chose to write about philosophical figures who contribute to the continuity thesis as well as to ask philosophical questions that refrain from taking up a universal or a priori position in favor of those that emphasize the continuity of the sensible and intellectual realm.

Much of this was worked out in Deleuze's Difference and Repetition, in the claim that thought consists of differential relations rather than the unity of a representation or of identity. This is again reflected in Deleuze's choice of the Stoics over Plato, paradox over good sense and common sense, Aion over Chronos, schizoanalysis over psychoanalysis, assemblage over thing, problematics over mathematical axiomatics, nomad over royal science, and of course, intensities over extensities. In each case, Adkins points out that Deleuze and Deleuze and Guattari choose ontological univocity whose end points express tendencies along a continuum, where intensity refers to movement and becoming (16).

Adkins' analysis moves from "plateau" to plateau as set out by Deleuze and Guattari, explaining that a plateau is an assemblage that organizes intensive processes into temporary stable states that can be given specific dates but can neither persist nor be repeated. Among these plateaus, the "Rhizome," "The Body Without Organs," "Becoming- Intense . . ., " "Nomadology," and "The Smooth and the Striated" have probably received the greatest attention from readers who have utilized these concepts in a variety of artistic, social, psychological and political contexts. In these as well as the other plateaus, Adkins seeks to show continuity at work.

The rhizome is an image of thought for assemblages that organize themselves in non-hierarchical lateral networks that experiment with new and heterogeneous connections that may mix "words, things, power, and geography" (25). As such, it is the very image of multiplicity that is never a "one" because each connection leads to other connections creating a multi-dimensional assemblage such as when a wasp attempts to mate with an orchid, creating a completely new connection. The "mapping" of such rhizomatic connections is an immanent and continuous process that reveals the creation of new connections and dimensions with no interference or commands from outside. It can be contrasted with Freud's interpretation of the dream of the "Wolf-Man" as stemming from the "primal scene" and thus organized by the father, mother, baby triad reducible to the Oedipus complex and constitutive of neurosis (36,37).

By contrast, the "schizo" free associates and schizoanalysis is then concerned with multiplicities not unities and tends towards the "Body without Organs," the limits of the dis-organized organism freed of Oedipal strictures, and so able to enter into new intensive relations and combinations (98). Thus the Body without Organs is itself a field of immanence, producing connections, a process of production, which Deleuze refers to as "desire" (105).

Deleuze and Guattari articulate strata and stratification, the process of giving form to matter, and content to expression as something that takes place in the physical, the organic, and the linguistic worlds. This section of Adkins' text is somewhat uncharacteristically confusing, no doubt because Deleuze and Guattari fill it with many new concepts and connections. Matter is at first the "abstract machine," the unformed, unorganized, nonstratified body of the earth with all its flows of subatomic and submolecular particles.

Simultaneous with this flow, there are stratifications, for example, layers of geological formations, in which matters in flows are given form. The first articulation, the form of content or form of substance refers to so-called raw materials and their qualities, which are always already organized and never just brute material.

The first articulation of matter is sedimentation. So, one grain of sand is joined by another, A then A. It resonates on the basis of its properties with another and another to form a series; then one series resonates with another to form systems. Selection is made of metastable molecular or quasi-molecular units, which are given a statistical order of connection and succession. There, in that particular site under those particular conditions, certain characteristics of these formed substances are actualized.

But formed substances are still not fully stratified, not fully stabilized. The first articulation "A" exhibits a double articulation "B of A" or simply "BA." A second articulation constructs molar compounds, stable functional structures. Sediment hardens into sedimentary rock. Thus in the second articulation phenomena are unified, totalized, integrated, and hierarchized. The term form of expression refers to methodology, or a manner of proceeding, whether it is in the physical, the organic or the linguistic realm. As Adkins notes, double articulations are physical, organic, and linguistic. Existing on every stratum, Deleuze and Guattari refer to them as "God."

These same terms are brought to bear on linguistics, where the first articulation concerns content, the second expression or functional structures, and where both content and expression have substance and form and so are always relative to one another. Against linguists who maintain that language is informational and communicational Deleuze and Guattari propose the order-word, the abstract machine that is both a command and a word creating order. It is a function coextensive with language.

But language is inseparable from action, meaning pragmatics (67, 69). It participates in a relay between forms of expression (the pure event that inheres or subsists in the proposition) and the actions and passions of bodies in concrete social formations. That is, language (expression/enunciation) intervenes in circumstances (as incorporeal transformations) and those circumstances of life are reflected again in language. These relationships are referred to as the abstract machine, which connects language to the semantic and pragmatic contents of statements, to collective assemblages of enunciation (the dominant significations), and to the micropolitics of the social field.

We can see that we have once and for all abandoned what Austin calls the "old doctrine about meaning" in favor of a new doctrine about "all the possible forces of utterances," the positioning of bodies in a field of forces. This is the subject of Deleuze and Guattari's "regimes of signs," which explore the ways in which order-words organize linguistic expression and so-called "pass-words" open access to the outside.

The chapter "Year Zero: Faciality" examines two of these regimes, the despotic signifying regime of signs when it mixes with the passional, post-signifying regime of signs to create faciality, the sign regime of normality and deviance, and the site of overcoding (109). This structure organizes faces in relation to a standard, whether that of Christian God or that of "White Man." Adkins contrasts this with the face conceptualized by Emmanuel Levinas, for whom the face is always that of the other, and to the Marxist and Critical Theorist critiques of ideologies of race, class, and gender.

Other, later chapters engage with Deleuze and Guattari's engagement with the novella in terms of the content/expression structure; micropolitics and segmentarity in terms of molar and molecular structures; becoming as the undoing of dualisms that organize society; the refrain as a plane of consistency organized rhizomatically that evades spatial thinking; and nomadology, the treatise on the war machine that is exterior to State power on the model of nomad science, reality as flows, becomings, heterogeneity, and problems with solutions. These chapters are no less important to Deleuze and Guattari's project than the previous ones, but they put into play the many concepts previously developed.

In the two plateaus, the "The Treatise on Nomadology -- The War Machine" and the "Apparatus of Capture," the positioning of bodies in a field of forces is taken up in some detail. Nomads remain undifferentiated from one another in what is called smooth space, which has no predetermined positions. Each path may be said to be like every other. The State, however, constitutes space as striated, regulating money, commerce, and people, as they move through it (204, 205). Arithmetic and geometry, weapons and tools, affects and feelings, jewelry and signs, free-action and work all find their place within one of each of these two orders. The "Apparatus of Capture" "introduces complicating factors such as urban centers and capitalism" defined not by Marxist modes of production but by machinic processes, assemblages that stratify and destratify, and produce organization and consistency, stasis and change (218).

In place of the linear evolution of social systems, Deleuze and Guattari propose that they emerge simultaneously. But while a town "consists" in a horizontal network, a State is always a vertical and hierarchical system. States capture other social formations and push them beyond their network "limit" across a threshold into becoming a component of a stratified State. Yet this overcoding gives rise to flows that escape it like the transients or homeless who live on the edge or in the streets of the city. Yet when capitalism emerges it is always ready to conjoin decoded or deterritorialized flows, which allows the axiomatic of capital to find equivalences among them. This is the case for citizens as much as for land or commerce.

The final plateau, "The Smooth and the Striated", might well be the organizational principle of all of the previous plateaus although Adkins does not make this claim. Deleuze and Guattari model it in technology as embroidery and patchwork, the musical as rhythm, harmony and melody, the maritime as the sea and navigation, the mathematical as metric and non-metric multiplicity, the physical as work and free-action, and the aesthetic as the optical and the haptic primarily. Like Bergson's instinct and intelligence or memory and matter, the smooth and the striated are in the end two tendencies operative in every assemblage. Thus, they function on every plateau to organize its physical, organic and linguistic strata.

Given the complexity of A Thousand Plateaus, the torrent of concepts and structures it introduces and puts into play, Adkins has done a remarkable job of introducing this material to the reader. It would be ideal to read this book alongside Brian Massumi's A User's Guide to Capitalism and Schizophrenia: Deviations from Deleuze and Guattari, which does not purport to be an introduction but which covers this material from a slightly more technical perspective. Adkins does seem to lose the thread of continuity and discontinuity, possibly because in the end, A Thousand Plateaus is operating in terms set out originally by Deleuze in Difference and Repetition, which are mathematical and more than likely ontological or at least metaphysical. Without this, A Thousand Plateaus seems to be a multitude of concepts that occasionally intersect without even the organization of a rhizome. Nevertheless, Adkins' use of Spinoza throughout the book, which I have not focused on, will assist some readers who are familiar with Spinoza's work. The many examples throughout are useful but sometimes veer off in directions that complicate rather than explicate the plateau at hand. Still, for readers who are searching for something that will help them to make sense of this daunting book, Adkins has provided a genuine introduction and guide, probably as accessible as such a book can be.