Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy of Freedom: Freedom's Refrains

Placeholder book cover

Dorothea Olkowski and Eftichis Pirovolaki (eds.), Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy of Freedom: Freedom's Refrains, Routledge, 2019, 232pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367077501.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


This is a volume of specialist essays, stemming from a 2015 conference held in Athens, Greece, organized by one of the first promoters of Anglophone scholarship on Deleuze, Constantin Boundas, now Emeritus Professor of Philosophy at Trent University in Ontario, Canada. (One of the editors, Dorothea Olkowski, is herself an early adopter of Deleuze, beginning her work on him in the early 1990s.) Not for newcomers to the field -- perhaps because freed of a requirement to bring novices up to speed -- the essays here are carefully wrought and thought-provoking, and will reward experienced readers with either clear restatements of established points (no mean feat with thinkers as difficult as Deleuze and Guattari) or with new approaches (also noteworthy now that Anglophone scholarly work on, or inspired by, Deleuze and Guattari, is well into its third decade). In other words, the collection is useful both in its "centripetal" function of deepening our understanding of some familiar points and in its "centrifugal" function of pointing us outward into multiple discourses and practices into which Deleuze scholarship can lead.

Although one would expect from the title a sharp focus on "freedom" and on "the refrain," some of the essays do not explicitly take up that pairing, but instead range over Deleuzean and Deleuzo-guattarian topics in metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, aesthetics, and politics. However, Olkowski's Introduction smartly asks us to see that what we are used to seeing as the work produced by invoking the concept of "freedom" is instead done by "the refrain," which she glosses as "a crystal of space-time that acts upon its surrounds and extracts from those surrounds vibrations, decompositions, projections, or transformations" (xii). Rather than hunting for exact word matches, then, we might be able to detect "freedom" and "the refrain" forming a non-systematic "consistency" among the essays, a loose hanging-together releasing resonances and dissonances among and across them dealing with novelty, experimentation, indeterminacy, the "nomadic," and other Deleuzean or Deleuzo-guattarian themes.

The fourteen essays are grouped into five sections. Jean-Clet Martin leads off the first section, "Infinite Speeds and the Machine," with "Deleuze and the Freedom of Machines." The title fits; this essay is the one most clearly concerned with "freedom." Spinoza, Kant, Descartes, and Jean-Luc Nancy are brought on stage, bringing us along a line of investigation tracking the interrelations of freedom with life, chance, indeterminism, and indifference, culminating in Nancy's notion of a "chaogito," a subject who lives released from finality and judgment and who embraces the dice throw. Thoughtful, even lyrical, the essay moves comfortably among concepts, producing an effect that is neither demonstrative nor arbitrary, but evocative.

It is Michael J. Ardoline who tackles the question of "infinite speeds," in an innovative essay one wishes were available during the Science Wars of the 1990s. Ardoline examines the use of "infinite speeds" in the discussion of concepts in What Is Philosophy?. I had always taken that term to refer to a sort of simultaneity or timelessness in the conceptual realm -- when you grasp what, say, the cogito means, you don't have to spend time traversing its components in your mind, but you grasp them all at once. Ardoline shows, however, that there is a problem in Newtonian physics in which multiple interactions of particles can accelerate a particle so that it would in effect leave the causal order, thus in a sense exiting the universe. Conversely, a particle might pop into the universe (hence the term "space invaders" for this phenomenon). Insofar as General Relativity sets the speed of light as the limit for its formulas, "infinite speeds" is confined to the status of an interesting quirk for Newtonian physics. Ardoline picks it up though to show that the characteristics of "space invaders" fit what Deleuze and Guattari say about the employment of concepts: 1) it is risky, because indeterminate; 2) it is non-representational; 3) it forms a plane of immanence with other concepts; and 4) it affects the degrees of freedom of the system it forms. This paper is a bit short, reflecting its origin in a conference presentation, but it is fascinating and sent me off on a fruitful quest of further reading in physics and re-reading of What is Philosophy?.

Three essays in the "Philosophy and Language" section follow. Olkowski's "Try Madness: Creation and the Crystalline Brain" looks to isolate the "aesthetic figure" as an artistic complement to the "conceptual personae" at work in philosophy according to What is Philosophy?. For Olkowski, the "aesthetic figure" is de-subjectified or non-cognitive, due to the shock of an encounter. In building her analysis, Olkowski first adduces Deleuze's reading of the Kantian sublime, and then recapitulates the analyses of Logic of Sense, contrasting Carroll's surface effects and Artaud's cries from the depths of the body. An unexpected but fruitful step is then taken when she looks at Bergsonian indeterminism as breaking perception and action, coupled with readings of the crystal-image in Cinema 2, and the concluding section of What is Philosophy?, "From Chaos to the Brain." The essay is one of a number in the collection (Ardoline's and Corry Shores' are others) that bring scientific and logical concepts to bear in an illuminating fashion.

Daniel W. Smith's thesis in "Sense and Literality: Why There Are No Metaphors in Deleuze's Philosophy," is that the relation of Deleuze's concepts to the language in which they are expressed is intensive, and hence cannot be grasped by the opposition between beyond literal vs metaphorical, which is entirely in realm of sense. Smith positions his analysis by invoking the dynamic genesis of language in the second part of Logic of Sense, which distinguishes among the primary (intensity, depth, noise, body), secondary (surface of sense/nonsense), and tertiary (propositions and functions of designation, manifestation, signification, and expression) registers. Smith's key move then is his claim that "the analyses of concepts proposed in What is Philosophy? are a transposition of the analysis of language provided in Logic of Sense" (58). On this view, the literal-metaphorical distinction is displaced, being conditioned by "the intensity-becoming complementarity" (59). Using the example of "the unconscious is a factory" from Anti-Oedipus, Smith shows the phrase to be a "becoming" of a concept of unconscious, that is to say, the creation of a new concept. Insofar as concepts are multiplicities, defined by borders with others where it takes a line of flight qua self-transformation, then a "philosophical concept is not a metaphor but a metamorphosis" (61). Erudite and clear, this essay reinforces Smith's reputation in the forefront of Deleuze scholars.

Gregg Lambert's entitles his essay "Who Are Deleuze's Conceptual Personae?," invoking one of the most interesting notions developed in What is Philosophy?. For Lambert, the "agency of enunciation" set up by conceptual personae is not the same as the philosopher as subject. It is instead a collective movement of thought allowing for the creation of "schools of thought" or "isms," in which sympathetic and antipathetic agents appear through "empathic identification." The result of seeing the history of reception of philosophers in this "dramaturgical" way reveals a "drama of attraction, repulsion, sympathy, empathy, and antipathy unfolded around certain conceptual personae of great philosophers" (70). With a certain panache, Lambert shows how conceptual personae have "essential relations to the stereotype of the social personage in the comic form (stock character), the cliché in the literary form, and the dogmatic image in the moral form of thinking" (76). Hence the philosophical landscape abounds with "semi-tragic battles and agonistic contests . . . comic figures and public spectacles" (76). Lambert includes a lacerating line that made me wince with a certain chagrined self-recognition: "the democratizing role of modern commentary has often been to replace the authority of the philosophical enunciation with an image of thinking that expresses a common sense understanding" (75). Bracing and provocative, this essay throws an important, in fact at times harsh, light on the academic practices of those of us who have at one time or another, whole-heartedly or for sake of convenience, called ourselves "Deleuzean."

The section on "Beyond Politics" shows the geographical breadth of the collection, with authors from Portugal, Greece, the United States, and Algeria.

In "Kafka and Melville: The Same Struggle for a People to Come?," Catarina Pombo Nabais looks at the Deleuzo-guattarian theme of literature as the collective enunciation of a minor people, uncovering therein different modes of the "fabulative function." Melville's Bartleby is compared along a number of dimensions to Kafka's Gregor Samsa. While both authors are concerned with inventing a people who are missing, Kafka does his work as minority in a majority, while Melville is the spokesperson of great nation of immigrants. The biggest difference is that Bartleby is ethical rather than political, insofar as his fabled non-preference is the exploration of new forms of "unpower" (86). Pombo Nabais concludes by discerning a shift within Deleuze's writing: "From the book on Kafka to the text on Melville, we can see a Deleuzean displacement from politics to ethics, from a theory of power/unpower to a theory of possible/impossible. Thus the big question about the relation between literature and life has been moved" (87).

Sotiria-Ismini Gounari writes on the affective politics of scapegoating during the Greek crisis starting in 2008. She relies on the distinction of bodily affect and conscious emotion found in the work of Brian Massumi, as he reads Deleuze and Guattari on Spinoza. Gounari usefully articulates that with the distinction of molecular flow and molar segmentation drawn in part from Gabriel Tarde. The essay puts its concepts to work in analyzing two case studies: that of HIV-positive women sex workers (often immigrants), and that of refugees as disease vectors pitting Greek against foreigner and healthy against sick. Government and media manipulation of shame and guilt in targets and fear in population result in a situation of mutual hate. But each intervention aimed at protecting a molar "majority" produces a resistance qua minoritarian becoming and "nomadic affects" of solidarity groups. But that in turn releases fascist counter-attack in the form of Golden Dawn. While the essay is extremely useful in utilizing the under-appreciated mode of the case study, it is also useful in showing what we are up against, as it ends on a down note emphasizing the State's power during "crisis" to recode and reterritorialize affective flows in anxious atomized individuals producing a consent to the perspective and perceived needs of the majority.

In "Political Improvisation and 'the Long March Through the Institutions'," Eugene W. Holland extends his analyses in Nomad Citizenship (Minnesota, 2011), which deals with social movements outside capital and the state, to strategies and tactics of those working within existing institutions. Holland first nicely shows that Althusser's notion of interpellation is not that of a subject as such, but of a citizen. Subjects are also in family, friendship, economic, and leisure relations, which operate more by solicitation or attraction than by interpellation. From there, Holland draws on the analysis of institutions in an early essay by Deleuze on Bergson, "Instincts and Institutions"; here institutions are, as Holland quotes Deleuze, "organized systems of means . . . of possible satisfaction" of material needs or tendencies (109). The problem comes when, in a situation of artificial scarcity, people become locked into the practices of actually existing institutions which can then control them, and which, in turn, solicit their members into supporting the reproduction of the institution's current form, rather than experimenting with ways to better supply the needs that provoked the institutions' formation. The application of this model to the West's addiction to petroleum in the age of climate change makes for a sobering ending to this thought-provoking essay.

Mohamed Moulfi's "Geophilosophy and Revolution in Gilles Deleuze" focuses on the relation of history and contingency. Reading the chapter on "Geophilosophy" in What is Philosophy?, Moulfi shows how Deleuze and Guattari defeat the notion of a unitary origin or completion. There is instead, in the tri-partite action of tracing the plane of immanence, inventing conceptual personae, and creating multi-component concepts, an always-already recommenced deterritorialization to reach the plane of immanence, and reterritorialization on the concept. In addressing the question of a becoming-revolutionary, Moulfi produces a particularly nice observation that both philosophy and revolution need distance from the present as seen by historical narrative: "if to think is to experiment, this means that philosophy extracts itself from our present to assume the duty of diagnosing our actual becomings" (121). By the same token then, "revolution is like philosophy: it is the resistance to the present, and the openness to the unpredictable, 'the new, the remarkable, the interesting'" (122).

The section on "Art and Creation" contains two essays. Philippe Mengue, in "Dismantling the Land(scape), Dismantling the Face," turns to Deleuze and Guattari's pairing of the "face/landscape" in A Thousand Plateaus in order to disrupt a complacent modernism that tells the story of art's escape from mimesis and accession to its painterly essence. Mengue questions a Whig modernist reading of Deleuze's fascination with Francis Bacon: Bacon is not superior to Velasquez or Giotto; Deleuze is not sketching a teleological history. Hence, for Mengue, Deleuze must hold that "art has no history (understood as history of progress) and that its universal defining goals -- the capturing of forces and the tracing of lines of escape -- belong to all artworks insofar as they are true artworks" (131). There follows a reading of the face/landscape pairing which Mengue summarizes as "the landscape is a world in the process of deterritorialization; . . . it emphasizes the absolute deterritorialization that is at work in the face" (142). He concludes with showing that Deleuze and Guattari do have a "real mimesis" in mind when it comes to art, which "comes first because it is already inside Nature and Nature imitates it" (143). That is to say, art is not a tracing of a pre-existing reality, but it is not without model, insofar as it is a creation of its model.

Pascale Criton's brief and condensed "Intensive Differences and Subjectivations," sketches a reading of the refrain in terms of de-/re- territorialization, which she finds put to political use in Guattari's late work, notably Chaosmosis. There is a technical treatment of music as well, which will be of most use to those familiar with the avant-garde musical references she provides (Varèse, Nono, Xenakis, Boulez).

Three essays comprise the concluding section, "Deleuze and Others." The first is Alan D. Schrift's "Pluralism = Monism: What Deleuze Learns From Nietzsche and Spinoza." Schrift expertly shows how Deleuze reads each of his great predecessors through the lens of the other in terms that are at once onto-ethical (establishing a "plane of immanence" in which the encounters of bodies produce affects) and epistemo-political ("against the dogmatic image of thought"). The onto-ethical and epistemo-political come together in the analysis of the hopes of each philosopher to turn politics away from the sad affects generated by the "slave/tyrant/priest" axis to the construction of institutions raising the probability of active joyous encounters. These are familiar themes to those most likely to read this collection, but nonetheless the essay is exemplary in its clarity and concision.

In "Deleuze and Guattari's Geodynamism and Husserl's Geostatism: Two Cosmological Perspectives," Alain Beaulieu contrasts the geodynamic earth of Deleuze and Guattari with the "geostatic" earth of Husserl. For Husserl, the earth is the unmoving ground of perception in the lifeworld; for Deleuze and Guattari, the earth is the site of strange becomings and deterritorializations. Hence it cannot function in a classical "cosmo-philosophy" in which being rooted to the earth would allow a contemplation of the heavens that would bring balance to the soul. Among the deterritorializations promoted by Deleuze and Guattari's geophilosophy is the displacement of the origin of philosophy from Greece alone to Greece as a site of encounter with foreigners, traveling the edges of the Eastern empires. Hence the "missing people" that each philosopher seeks to find are different; Husserl looks to ground Europe from its drift into crisis, while Deleuze and Guattari want to find those willing to undergo experimentation with deterritorializing movements.

With his "Affirmations of the False and Bifurcations of the True: Deleuze's Dialetheic and Stoic Fatalism," Shores has produced what is to me the outstanding essay in the collection. He brings together logic, metaphysics, and ethics as they appear in Deleuze, the Stoics, and paraconsistent logics, in order to flesh out the implications of Deleuze's logic as "affirmative synthetic disjunction." Shores' is a fully worked out article rather than a rewritten conference paper, which many of the other essays are. (That's not a criticism of the others, since the collection does indeed stem from a conference.) He takes off from the observation that Deleuze's view of the virtual register is something like "Leibniz without God" (just as, from another angle, he wants a "Spinozism without substance"). That is to say, the virtual is composed of diverging paths, but with no guarantee in advance that the results of actualizing any set of them will be compossible and the events "harmonious." Actualization then is making choices among these paths, but since many other choices are being made by other actors, the choice of one path or another might work out well or it might bring things crashing down. Hence the need for amor fati as affirmation of the dice throw, to use one of Deleuze's images. I learned an enormous amount from this essay. It's fitting to have it appear at the end of the collection, as it "centrifugally" points the reader out into a vast range of discourses and practices that reading Deleuze can provoke.