Deleuze and Law

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Laurent de Sutter and Kyle McGee (eds.), Deleuze and Law, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 288pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748644131.

Reviewed by James Williams, University of Dundee


This is the first volume to bring together some of the most authoritative commentators on Deleuze, philosophy and law from both disciplines (to avoid confusion, there is an earlier and much more disparate volume with a very similar title edited by Braidotti, Colebrook and Hanafin which is not properly on legal practice, Deleuze and Law: Forensic Futures, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009). The newer collection is an important starting point for anyone interested in reflecting on the potential for a Deleuzian philosophy of law. Why only potential? Why Deleuzian and not Deleuze's?

In truth, the underlying textual facts justifying a volume on Deleuze and law are unpromising. Deleuze writes little about law as discipline or practice. His best known comments on the subject are general and anecdotal statements from his long interviews with Claire Parnet in a series of television interviews called L'abécédaire de Gilles Deleuze (Deleuze and Law, pp. 2-3) and from interviews with Antonio Negri, and with Raymond Bellour and François Ewald, reproduced in Negotiations (Deleuze and Law, pp. 20 and 80). Compared to his work on literature, politics, music, mathematics, biology or painting he did  not write much directly on law.

To give a sense of the autobiographical style and tentative tone of these dialogues: one of the best-known comments from the interviews is the admission that Deleuze would have studied law had he not taken philosophy. As ever, we ought to pay heed to the often playful direction of his answers. It is a tactic Deleuze used to separate his main texts from interviews, but also to render his thought as multi-layered event, as a humorous demand for interpretation. I certainly feel his amusement about the possible world of 'Deleuze the lawyer'. It is as likely to be a diversionary move or provocation as a plausible counter-factual. The writer of 'To have done with judgement' would have become a lawyer?

Deleuze has little truck for representation of possible worlds too close to ours. They reflect our sad passions and our broken dreams. The 'legal' Deleuze's world would have been a less joyful place than ours and a very different one, given the much greater promise he shows for innovative design and construction in philosophy than for legislation and judgement. As inventive system builder, disinclined to judge, defend or prosecute, Deleuze prefers to create novel systems resistant to law. Indeed, it turns out that even his avowed concern for law is about the ongoing construction of law as case-driven jurisprudence and not the application of principles or the founding of universal laws or codes.

This is why two of the most rewarding chapters of the volume, by Paul Patton and Alexandre Lefebvre, reflect on the possibility and status of rights after Deleuze. This work also begins with the uncomfortable interview comments made by Deleuze. They are uncomfortable because they attack some of our most deeply held commitments to human rights (pp. 15-19). They also betray his discomfort in having to make the attack (p. 48). Nonetheless, Patton convincingly explains Deleuze and Guattari's reasons for mistrust of rights, due to concerns with local and particular demands for temporary rights rather than the abstraction of timeless universals (pp. 16-18). For his part, Lefebvre gives a comprehensive study of Deleuze's and Guattari's arguments against human rights (pp. 49-51).

Deleuze's responses in the interviews have been taken literally in this collection, partly to lend support to the Deleuze and law connection but also, and with greater risks, to give direction to reflections on his work on law. The most surprising thing about the volume is that there is no sustained analysis of why Deleuze said so little about law, and even then mostly only in response to questions explicitly inviting him to do so. One reason might be that laws, in legal or scientific usage, have traditionally offered a powerful model for philosophy -- one about which Deleuze is explicitly critical (for instance, in Difference and Repetition) or ironic and humorous (for example, in his reading of Sacher-Masoch).

If a system of thought is driven by laws or jurisprudence, other deep forms of the system are also shaped strongly, with little leeway and with a pull towards tradition, by the historical continuity of law. Law's well-defined social functions and closeness to power preclude the world-shaking revolutions afforded to philosophy. Philosophy is inventively restless and critical of establishment. When thinkers seek to extend its direct social functions and political effectiveness through an association with law, they run the risk of betraying that revolutionary and critical quality. So another question missing from this volume is whether it might have been better to think of Deleuze's philosophy and its applications as efforts to live against and then beyond law and judgement.

The volume also rarely raises the doubt that Deleuze and Guattari's commitment to jurisprudence, a centrepiece of most of the chapters, is conservative and on the right, in contrast to their more familiar leftist struggles for minorities. This comes out most strongly when romanticism about case law makes strange allies for Deleuze and Guattari in the defence of English law against the European Court of Human Rights. The chapters by James MacLean and David Saunders give us helpful pictures of the legal oppositions and stakes involved but also reveal this overly hopeful approach to Deleuzian jurisprudence.

MacLean shows how law can be understood as proceeding according to the 'metaphor' of the rhizome (p. 166) but does not question whether this is desirable and to be encouraged or to be resisted and cast differently. What if your case-by-case rhizomatic becoming is drawn to repression? When tested by recent cases of evidence under torture and extradition to countries where there is a clear risk of torture, the English legal system has been at odds with the European court, which has taken and imposed a more firm line on torture (Othman (Abu Qatada) v. the UK). The same is true of prisoners' rights where English law is behind European rights-based law on the right to vote (Hirst No. 2 v. the UK).

In his chapter, David Saunders raises the doubt about the progressive nature of Deleuze's thought, as well as concerns about the ambiguity and contradictory nature of Deleuze's rare statements on law. His balanced arguments show the preliminary nature of research on Deleuze and law, and the formidable challenges it faces. All the other chapters would have benefited from an explicit engagement with the form of his essay: a difficult dialectic between case law and code-based law where the label 'progressive', understood as an effort to defend minority rights in specific situations, swings from case to code dependent not only on cases and situations but also on particular actors.

The other pieces would also have benefited from Saunders' historical examples, for instance concerning questions of privacy in sexual mores. It is worth adding that even in recent cases, and counter to plausible arguments that British society is becoming more permissive, English case law has contributed to a condemnation of consensual and private masochistic sexual practices (Regina v. Brown [1993] 2 All ER 75). Partly, Saunders' fruitful and disengaged approach stems from his juxtaposition of Latour and Deleuze. It is of course important to note that, unlike Deleuze, Latour has written at length about the practice of law.

So although Penelope Pether argues in her less self-critical chapter that Deleuze's work on literature can allow for the improvement of law through critique, there is an alternative reading for which Deleuze and Guattari endanger the banner cases around Guantánamo that she sees them as supporting. Similarly, contrary to Patton's defence of the local development of particular rights, cases of extradition and rendition and the globalisation of legal reach and concerns seem to point to the importance of the kind of universal rights that Deleuze and Guattari oppose.  At least, this is the direction that most of the chapters of Deleuze and Law suggest.

In response to these worries, it could be countered that the topics of the volume are preponderantly about legal frameworks, forms of judgement, rights and -- above all -- jurisprudence. These areas could be said to follow from a philosophy rather than direct it from the outset, since they build on prior philosophical concepts such as case and practice. Nonetheless, by far the longest discussions of laws in Deleuze's work are critiques of natural laws in the sciences and human sciences, as well as extensive critiques of judgement and of recognition. So there is an argument to be made for the construction of a philosophy of law departing from Deleuze's metaphysics. But inventing Deleuze's philosophy of law at the heart of his metaphysics conjures up (or wishes for) a new and quite different thinker.

In the interviews, Deleuze indeed repeats the bald proposition that his interest in law is based on jurisprudence, by which he means case law and case-by-case construction of law. To exemplify this kind of jurisprudence he appeals to a change in the legal designation of taxis in France from private rental to public transportation, leading to a corresponding change in the law about smoking in taxis. You rent the space; you can smoke in it. You share a social mode of transport; you'll bend to communal norms. Supposedly (and not entirely convincingly for French law) the case makes law, as the law considers the novel case. So what? Is this not mere biographical chitchat and superficial common sense about law of the very type Deleuze disliked in others? Marc Schuilenberg gives a deeper explanation of Deleuze's position by claiming that law advances through molecular becoming as molar laws are undermined and transformed through an openness to the molecular in jurisprudence (128).

But all this depends on the case and the transformation. What of cases and decisions that unify and create a molar identity, such as the movement towards duty of care, again in English law, cited positively by MacLean? The movement itself might be molecular, though this is far from clear given the eminence of the legal actors involved in leading cases, but the outcome seems molar given the ubiquity and organising role played by the duty in English law. It is quite possible to imagine a Nietzschean critique of duty of care, with its references to neighbours and tests regarding harm and proximity, which allow it to be seen as a new variant of traditional injunctions about neighbourly love. These may indeed be desirable, but it is far from clear that they satisfy the demands for local variation, novelty and attunement to the singularity of events as set out by Deleuze.

More promisingly, though, the thin direct evidence around Deleuze and law is supported as some kind of basis for the development of a philosophy of law by broad lines from Deleuze's philosophy and more so by his writings with Guattari. First, throughout their works, Deleuze and Guattari criticise transcendent codes, axioms and laws for their insufficiency regarding singular cases. Second, these transcendent forms are also undermined, in Nietzschean and Foucauldian fashion, by their concealed singular genealogies. Transcendent laws are abstracted arbitrarily from multiple historical evolutions. Their claims to universality are therefore illegitimate in terms of their own history and of its internal heterogeneity and forcefulness. Codes evolve in a struggle of forces. Their foundations are mythical where they make claims to universality, purity or timelessness.

Third, according to Deleuze and Guattari, codes, axioms and laws operate in necessary conjunction with singular created forms, with one-off arrangements bent to satisfy unique requirements. Law is an assemblage rather than a top down codification, or a logical operation following from intuitively true axioms, or a straightforward application of generally reliable laws. So, fourthly, the assembly, evolution and present creation of code and case might appear to be unified and continuous, but they evolve through the operation of multiple heterogeneous events that cannot be reduced to either code or case. Each case is part of wider events which may well suffer from the imposition of a transcendent legal model. This, however, will always be only an illegitimate act of force and hence open to resistance and counter-creations.

Note how these points make extensive use of Deleuze and Guattari. This shows another problem with the anecdotes about Deleuze and law. Yes, Deleuze made auto-biographical comments about law. However, the deepest work on laws, axioms and codes is written with Guattari in their inextricably entangled manner. The title 'Deleuze and Law' -- like many of the 'Deleuze and . . . ' volumes therefore does a double disservice. First, the elision of Guattari perpetuates the unjustified priority given to Deleuze in their joint works. Second, the absence of Guattari legitimates an easy extension of the ideas from their collaboration to Deleuze's single-authored works. However, for the work on law it is arguable that there is a much stronger critique of any priority to be given to ideas of code and law in Deleuze's independent works.

This leads to a final point about the essays in Deleuze and Law. None deduce a philosophy of law simply on the basis of Deleuze and Guattari's work. In fact, at key moments other thinkers have to be drawn in to plug gaps, solve puzzles or add to their ideas. Patton calls on Nietzsche and Connolly. Lefebvre and Moore draw on Bergson. Schuilenberg looks to Tarde, Lincoln to Camus, Saunders to Latour and Philippopoulos-Mihalopoulos to Braidotti. It is worth reflecting on the eclectic nature of these connections, which again show the instability and openness around the project of a Deleuzo-Guattarian philosophy of law. It is also worth reflecting on the fact that these associations do not follow Deleuze's interpretations of, say, Bergson or Nietzsche. Instead, there is a need to take a step away from his work both alone and with Guattari. In my view this is because their philosophies are essentially inimical to a philosophy of law, because their charting of the radical nature of thought as open creativity is resistant to a grounding of forms of legal construction and application, even if this is to be a formal grounding of case law.