Deleuze and the Body

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Laura Guillaume and Joe Hughes (eds.), Deleuze and the Body, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 229pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748638659.

Reviewed by Felicity Colman, Manchester Metropolitan University


The question of what is a body? provides an explosive pedagogical framework for thought. As a humanist ideal and capitalist imperative, "the body" is rejected in Deleuze's philosophy as anthropocentrism, but the activities of human bodies as productive of subjectivity provoke ethical questions for Deleuze. The human body is not the focus of Deleuze's work; it is neither a concept, nor is it treated as a specific context, rather "bodies" are Spinozist configurations. With Guattari, Deleuze comes to figure "bodies" as any body in the world; human or non-human, animate or inanimate. In this ongoing series of 'Deleuze and . . . ' books from Edinburgh University Press, "the body" is the catalyst. As each chapter in Deleuze and the Body circles this provocation and defines particular senses of body that Deleuze engages; the distinctions of definition provide a regime of the body as both life and as life's structuring expression. Such dualism in Deleuze's logic is a divisive point in Deleuzian scholarship: where some delight in technically detailing and toying with the metaphysics Deleuze sets up, others dismiss any notion of dialectics as a categorical error of reading Deleuze's philosophy. This volume presents a mix of approaches, and the sense of multiple positions is amplified as many of the chapters read are components of individual larger projects, rather than written specifically for the topic of the volume. It is both exciting and frustrating for the reader to follow the frequently condensed or fragmentary arguments, but such is the nature of edited volumes. In some of the arguments, a sense of a new era of Deleuzian thinking emerges, with a shift in register that has moved from the merely expository to the exploratory.

The book is divided into two parts: "Deleuzism" and "Practical Deleuzism", and each part contains five chapters. In his introductory chapter, one of the co-editors, Joe Hughes, explains that chapters in the first section describe the theory behind the body in Deleuze, while those in the second section perform more practical applications of this theory. Hughes points to the fact that even "theory" engages a specific practice, so the division the editors take is pragmatic. Nevertheless, one of the positive attributes of this series and this book is the enforced cohabitation of philosophers with cultural theorists, when never the two groups should otherwise meet, enabling the sense of the immanent body of Deleuzian thinking to emerge, however non-disciplinarily rigid that encounter may prove.

Claire Colebrook's chapter is the first of the 'Deleuzism' chapters. Colebrook provides a wide-ranging overview of various theoretical moves on the "embodied" subject. Colebrook invokes the body as posited by Lacan, Laplanche, Butler, Deleuze, Guattari, Grosz, among others, for a discussion on the "historical and political phenomena" of the body. She repeatedly reminds the reader that there is no body, and there is no matter, and briefly addresses how the "ideals of a body" that can be "identifiable through time" can be misleading. Colebrook concludes by offering a tantalizing fragment for thinking about how the sensible body, tasked with life's processes, might possibly unhitch itself from temporal organization, to enable a less composite position, a "direction", she writes, that is offered by Deleuze and by Deleuze and Guattari's thought (26).

While that position may leave readers somewhat displaced, John Protevi's chapter on Deleuze's conception of "larval subjects," autonomous systems, and the topic of E.Coli Chemotaxis provides a reorientation -- however not necessarily one that involves corporeal satisfaction. Protevi's Deleuze and the evolutionary body of what Protevi questions as "organic subjectivity" provide the most engaging treatment of the topic of this collection. Protevi locates Deleuze's biological panpsychism within the enaction position of Evan Thompson and the transduction of sense found in Gilbert Simondon (Deleuze engages with the latter in The Logic of Sense (1969)). Protevi also indicates the significance of Bergsonian and Whiteheadian registers within panpyschist philosophy but does not have the space in which to elaborate those connections. For example, Protevi all too briefly discusses how chemotaxis can be seen as a resonating Deleuzian figure, as it describes a movement towards or away from chemical substances, which is an attribute of all organisms and motile cells. Looking at single-cell organisms, Protevi notes that in order to figure the "sense" of an organism's "subjectivity," there is a three-fold sense to be considered; "sensibility, signification and direction" (42). The discussion of an organism, as Protevi argues, is well served through Deleuze and Guattari's focus on panpsychism -- a position that offers "fully material syntheses" (50) -- incorporating all aspects of the physical, as well as the cognitive, psychological, social senses. Protevi's discussion is indicative of the current generation of Deleuzian scholars' work in its registration of the significance of the Deleuzian oeuvre for 20th-century history of philosophy, and for the changes brought to the discipline by this work.

Interactivities of bodies in action and their directions after a mediating encounter is also the topic of Anna Cutler and Iain MacKenzie's contribution. They provide a chapter on pedagogy through the notion of "bodies of learning," where the body is described, through the analogy of learning to swim, as a way of thinking about the complex relations generated by different bodies involved in this physical, cognitive, and skill-based process. Cutler and MacKenzie's swimmer is human, following Deleuze's example in Difference and Repetition (1968), and develops an idea of affective cognition for the body, which has resonance with Protevi's position but ascribes a different image of the body. The extended body of the human, as Cutler and MacKenzie demonstrate, includes its interactive positions, such as the interaction with the water of the swimmer, and the anthropocentric knowledge required for (human) learning how to swim. Protevi's enaction argument demonstrates how there are so many more bodies to consider in this body of learning, where even passivity enacts a processual body, so a question for this chapter is the determination of the where of the "knowledge" that enacts upon their swimmer.

Cutler and MacKenzie do usefully remind us of the Deleuzian critique of the doxa of bodies in action, and in the second half of their chapter refer to the many other debates on the construction of the body, including the positions of Judith Butler, Merleau-Ponty, Elizabeth Grosz, Steven Rose and Eric Alliez. Together these prove to make for a rather too-dense field of discussion concerning the dualism of mind/body debates, leading the authors to conclude by posing a new set of criteria for learning, by positioning it as an activity that will "create new bodies of learning within the real" (71). But the unanswered question is what does this 'real' signal, and what is its purpose? The first section in the chapter seems to point to "the real" as an ontological condition that is a matter of perspective and process of productive communication between bodies (67), but this conclusion does beg for further elucidation especially in the context of the "becoming-brain of bodies" that is posited at the end of the chapter (70).

If we have by now some sense of what 'the body' in Deleuze's philosophy might be, then this ground is again shifted in the chapter by Joe Hughes, who poses the question of what might be the purpose of the cinematic body in Deleuze's work. Hughes looks at why Deleuze constructs a "Bergsonian body" for the cinema, where the body serves as an image, an interval, a process of production, yet also provides a figure that is a philosophical problem when posed against the corpus of cinema as well as alongside Deleuze's other work. Hughes concludes by drawing the ethical project of Deleuze's cinema books back to Difference and Repetition, which readers of Deleuze recognize as being closely linked.

Hughes also offers a critique of Deleuze's stipulation that cinema needs to bring forth "an ethics or a faith" (73; 83). Deleuze's requirement of the cinema (as he describes it toward the end of Cinema 2: The Time-Image), places the anthropocentric body at its centre point. This "believing body", Hughes argues, can be examined through the four aspects of actualization that Deleuze attributed to Bergson in Bergsonism (88). Hughes pushes two aspects of this actualization process and here links up to Deleuze's larger project on thought (via Deleuze's Nietzsche and Spinoza) -- "thinking and life" -- as creative of new life, and new configurations of the body (91). As with Cutler and MacKenzie's chapter, Hughes offers a way of thinking about the larger pedagogic project within Deleuze's philosophy. As Hughes argues, another commentary on Bergson through the cinema would describe an actualization of the senses, "according to the possibilities of life created by the artistic will" (92). He suggests that further work needs to be undertaken to fully explore the ethics of the body as posited by Deleuze in the cinema books, via Bergson. This is a significant point; as other commentators have noted, Deleuze explicitly rejects the development of a logic of just one kind in his cinema books, and later with Guattari in What is Philosophy? Instead, in the cinema books, Deleuze argues for the regime of Bergson's matter to be examined -- as the image that provides the variable to the functionalism that the system of cinema prescribes. This image is the body of life for Deleuze.

Nathan Widder's chapter on "Matter as Simulacrum" is the last of the "Deleuzism" chapters and begins with a discussion on Deleuze's ontology of sense, in order to confront the creation of synthesis of oppositional terms with which to understand Deleuze's sense of being as difference. Widder reminds us of one of the key points of Deleuze's conditional qualification of difference: "being is expressive" and it "expresses sense" (96). Widder's chapter presents an explication of what he argues are the three key topics that Deleuze discusses throughout his work and that together form the ontological difference of the body as an event that is constitutive of sense. According to Widder, these three may be summarized as: 1. Plato and the simulacrum; 2. The Stoics' reversal of Platonism and Deleuze's claims for the production of phantasma; and 3. Klein's role in the contestation of Oedipal development. Although this chapter reads as somewhat truncated, the complexity of issues that Widder sets up are skillfully interwoven, although there are many other sets of dialectic positions that feed the Deleuzian philosophy of difference that are not mentioned here. In conclusion, the specific point for this body of Widder-Deleuze sense is the Oedipal phantasm (111).

Part two, 'Practical Deleuzism', begins with a chapter by Ella Brians on "the Virtual body" and the relation of Deleuze's work with "cyberspace and the posthuman" (117). After pointing out that Deleuze was not a "cybertheorist" (!), Brians argues that his work can be usefully employed to "challenge certain tendencies in cyber theory" (117). The chapter has sections that present various positions on what constitutes that field of "cyberspace", before coming back at the end to situate Deleuze within this field. Brians reflects on the "cyber" in Weiner, Turing, Gibson, The Matrix, and AI; on the internet, related art projects and critics including Hayles; and on the Cyborg Manifesto by Haraway, with problematization of the terms for the cyborg through Moravec and Hayles. The last section before the conclusion provides a summary of how Deleuze's and Deleuze and Guattari's work might be situated in the "posthumanist debates" (130). The conclusion offers some ways into the wide range of material canvassed, yet this chapter does not convince this reader that Deleuze's work is useful for the project sketched here. Perhaps the "virtual body" and what that possibly means could have been better fleshed out through Guattari's critique of machinic subjectivation.

Rebecca Coleman also examines the problem of the relations between body and its image as represented in popular cultural forms. Coleman's focus is on the capitalist process of "self-transformation", as a value-added commodity that is productive of certain "possibilities of embodiment" (144). Drawing from feminist theories of film and media, Coleman's chapter addresses how the sense of self that is given materiality by the media is consistently denied as a possible body, through the continual market slippage of what might constitute attainment. Coleman carefully builds her argument on the work of Angela McRobbie, Jackey Stacey and Elizabeth Grosz, choosing elements of these theorists' work as evidence for her argument on how "self-transformation" works. Coleman usefully articulates the processual materialization of the media-constructed bodies, rather than describing the "ideological meaning of an image" (150). Also looking to the materiality of the image, rather than the matter (as Hughes does), is the chapter by Peta Malins on the clichés involved in images of drug-taking bodies as used in commodity culture. Like Coleman, and MacCormack in the following chapter, Malins enlists Deleuze's argument on the work of the English painter Francis Bacon, in order to discuss the "sensation" provided by images of the body in encounters with other bodies, including chemicals, art and advertising. Malins critiques the image of "heroin chic" and describes the limitations of arguments that suggest that art can offer any relief to the imperatives of capitalist consumptive tactics that in fact need the drugged as much as the sober body.

Patricia MacCormack's chapter also examines how aesthetic disturbances to the sense of capitalist normativity can offer relief for the body, but her chapter switches attention to incorporate materiality as a mattering of the body. MacCormack looks at the "multi-dimensional modifications" of the surface and just under the surface of the human body, as signifiers of processual difference, rather than as capitalist-defined communities that may be target-marketed. Pushing Guattari's and Deleuze and Guattari's sense of becoming outside of the Christian body and into animal territory, MacCormack elaborates on the aesthetic and morphological differences of animal skin. MacCormack draws on the arguments of Serres and Kafka for evidence of the chapter's claims for the creation of new flesh and thus new bodies by modification.

In lieu of a conclusion, it falls to the final chapter in this section by Philipa Rothfield to offer some determination of the Deleuzian sense of the body that emerges from this volume. Rothfield's chapter is on dance, the passing moment and Deleuze's Nietzsche, and begins by positing: "Deleuze's Nietzsche aims to provoke a better kind of life" (203). The ways in which the body can be characterized, and indeed "reevaluated" (208) are through the inter-activities of different forces that are generative and destructive of a range of connections and relations. After Rothfield carefully describes these senses of the Deleuzian Nietzschian force, the chapter turns to ask how these activities of the dynamic relations of force are to be located as "implicit in dancing" (212) Enlisting work on the rhythm of forces in dance by Thomas DeFrantz, Rothfield argues that the body is a "reactive apparatus", and that in the dancing body's capacity for reaction, it has a "superiority" over the merely active body (219). Whether we can ascribe an aesthetic sense such as Rothfield ascribes to dancers to other bodies under reaction to external forces - from the E. Coli's reactive movements, or the bodies of more or less dynamically-abled bodies, of the athlete, protester, soldier, migrant, disabled, chemically enhanced, externally modified, worker, child -- remains unanswered here, but the transformative potential of a body's reaction is affirmed and the volume ends on a somewhat utopic note.

In trying to find some common ground to orient oneself while reading this heaving collection, what emerges is an uneasy and incomplete view of Deleuzian approaches trying to define what we might have called a philosophy of mind, or an 'embodied' methodology, but which under the Deleuzian transmission, becomes a proper philosophy of sense; sense that uses 'body' in the same way as philosophy uses 'mind' as a vectorializing figure. In their collective disquiet, the contents of this volume offer up a number of transdisciplinary positions regarding the matter of the body.