Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation

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Joe Hughes, Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation, Continuum, 2008, 192pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062840.

Reviewed by Gregory Flaxman, University of North Carolina (Chapel Hill) and Abe Geil, Duke University



The nature of Gilles Deleuze’s relationship to phenomenology is among the most vexing problems of his philosophical genealogy. Broadly construed, the problem appears to consist in a kind of contradiction between Deleuze’s explicit statements about phenomenology and his implicit affinity for its methods and inclinations. On the one hand, in interviews and recollections, Deleuze consistently describes his own entry into the milieu of academic philosophy against the dominant landscape of phenomenology. In the 1950s, when he first began to write, the French philosophical establishment was given over to the “suffocating” conditions of phenomenology and the tradition of the “three H’s” (Hegel, Husserl, and Heidegger). Hence, Deleuze’s turn to Nietzsche, Bergson, Spinoza and the genealogy of a minor philosophy seems to constitute nothing less than a kind of escape, a line of flight from the institution of phenomenology.

But on the other hand, and despite his seeming antagonism, Deleuze consistently expresses his admiration for phenomenology and, more particularly, a number of its partisans, including Sartre, Hippolyte, Wahl, and Merleau-Ponty. This affinity is perhaps most clearly expressed in an early essay, “He Was My Teacher” (1964), in which Deleuze embarks on a remembrance of Sartre. “Our teachers, once they reach adulthood, are those who bring us something radical and new, who know how to invent an artistic and literary technique, finding those ways of thinking that correspond to our modernity,” Deleuze characteristically begins, but in what follows, he subtly switches registers. “We know there is only one value for art, and even for truth: the ‘first-hand,’ the authentic newness of something said and the ‘unheard music’ with which it is said.”1 Inasmuch as expression is linked to experience, he adds, Sartre’s genius defined the phenomenological possibilities that Deleuze’s philosophy would invariably take up, namely, the “pre-judgmental” and “sub-representational”2 — or what we might simply call ontology. But to what degree is Deleuze’s own (and very idiosyncratic) ontology indebted to phenomenology?

This question lies at the heart of Joe Hughes’ Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation, which contends that, in elaborating the eponymous problem, Deleuze offers an account that is deeply indebted to the transcendental logic of phenomenology. In this regard, the uniqueness of Hughes’ book consists in having moved beyond (or before) the work of Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, or even Heidegger, to that of Husserl. As Hughes rightly points out, the majority of the Anglo-American literature on the relation between Deleuze and phenomenology has dwelt on the latter’s French tradition, most often in terms of Merleau-Ponty, in order to consider the raw nature of experience and the embodiment of perception. By contrast, Hughes turns to Husserl for a strictly formal philosophical model for the genesis of representation. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation begins from the precisely circumscribed definition of phenomenology provided by Husserl’s assistant Eugen Fink. According to this definition, phenomenology is oriented around two essential elements: the method of the phenomenological reduction (or epoché) and the problem of genetic constitution. Hughes’s sweeping claim is that “Deleuze’s thought unfolds entirely within these two general orientations of phenomenology” (3).

Whatever one thinks of the claim itself, the rhetorical advantages of this point of departure become clear in the course of Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. To begin with, the minimalism of Fink’s definition allows Hughes to altogether avoid many of Deleuze’s directly anti-phenomenological statements by taking off the table those Husserlian concepts that Deleuze explicitly rejects — intentionality, the transcendental subject, the noesis/noema distinction, and so on. But more importantly, the formalism of this determination of phenomenology provides the architecture of Hughes’s reading of Deleuze. Indeed, Hughes adopts the late Husserl’s account of genetic constitution as a template for identifying a powerful “structural homology” (98) that unites Difference and Repetition, The Logic of Sense, and Anti-Oedipus. By elucidating this structure, Hughes argues, we can navigate through the dizzying array of technical terms that Deleuze generates over the course of these three works in the basis of a remarkably systematic and systematizing commentary: what initially promises to be a phenomenological redescription of Deleuze’s philosophical project gradually becomes an ambitious thesis about the structural consistency of that project. In this respect, Hughes’ polemic builds toward an inversion of Jean-Jacques Lecercle’s seemingly unobjectionable claim that Deleuze’s philosophy, like Nietzsche’s, is coherent but not systematic. By contrast, Hughes asserts that “Deleuze’s use of language is highly unreliable” (79): his texts are systematic but “incoherent because, while a relatively stable structure persists throughout all three books, the technical terms used to describe that structure change” (155).

What justifies this approach? Hughes invokes the narratological distinction between story and plot to describe the strategy of isolating the singular structure of genetic constitution from Deleuze’s radically heterogeneous vocabulary. But a more profound rationale for the project might be found within the protocols of phenomenology itself: in addition to the phenomenological reduction and the problem of genesis, Hughes implicitly draws upon a third Husserlian mandate, the search for invariants. In fact, the pursuit of a relatively invariable structure for genesis is what makes his reading at once so heuristically powerful and yet so foreign to Deleuze’s own thought, which remains intimately concerned with matters of style and expression. There is much to be said on this score, but Deleuze and The Genesis of Representation deserves to be read on its own terms, namely, as a radical re-situation of Deleuze’s philosophy. Not only does Hughes provide detailed and rigorous readings of genetic constitution in Difference and Repetition, The Logic of Sense, and Anti-Oedipus, but he (audaciously) places his account of genesis at the center of all of Deleuze’s philosophy. Genesis becomes the master signifier for the entire Deleuzian lexicon:

The only way to understand Deleuze’s texts is to understand them as a theorization of genesis and the only way to understand a Deleuzian concept … is to determine its place and function within the genesis in which it participates (16).

Given how much Hughes has riding on the structure of genesis, it’s worth providing a brief sketch of that structure. In effect, genetic constitution names the problem of how meaning arises from meaningless corporeal experience. For Hughes, reading Deleuze, genesis describes something like the passage from a molecular field of chaotic materialities to a molar field of individuated representations. There are two basic strategies for tracing this passage, “regressive” and “progressive.” The regressive method begins by bracketing the “natural attitude” and moving from ordinary empirical judgments to the experiences that found them and back further from experience to its origins in sensation. The methodological rationale for this bracketing — the famous “phenomenological reduction” — is to avoid deducing the transcendental field from the data of empirical experience, which, after all, must be grasped as a production of the transcendental in the first place. Hughes identifies two places in Deleuze’s work where he makes use of the reduction (without naming it as such) in order to produce a regressive account of genesis. In Proust and Signs, after disappointments with both objectivism and subjectivism (this correlates, in Hughes’s reading, to the “natural attitude”), the “apprentice’s path” confirms the necessity of the reduction on his way to discovering the “already given sense” of the sign (7). The second and more convincing instance of Deleuze’s adoption of the reduction lies in the systematic critique of the “image of thought” in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze’s contention that philosophical thought has failed to escape the “circle of representation” is homologous with the situation of the natural attitude, Hughes argues, because it repeats the error of taking an empirical figure of thought for its transcendental condition. thus, he educes, the dogmatic image of thought is “exactly the problem the phenomenological reduction is intended to resolve” (7). On Hughes’s reading, Deleuze’s attempt to produce a truly critical image of thought involves an account of the genesis of representation: by “opposing representation,” Difference and Repetition necessarily “becomes a theory of representation” (8).

It’s worth noting that, after dwelling on these examples, Hughes abruptly abandons the reduction, no less the regressive approach to genetic constitution. In fact, the substance of Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation consists in a careful reconstruction of the progressive approach. Indeed, “progressive determination” reverses the direction of the regressive movement in order to trace the genesis of representation according to the logic of its own production: in other words, its very method is genetic. The basic structure of the progressive genesis is comprised of two parts, a “dynamic genesis” and a “static genesis.” The dynamic genesis is so-named because it begins “where there is only movement and not time” (24). As Hughes argues, in The Logic of Sense this stage is called “dynamic genesis”; in Anti-Oedipus it’s called “desiring production”; in Difference and Repetition it’s called the “production of time.” Whatever the case, the structure of this stage is comprised of three passive syntheses that produce the movement from the “primary order” of sensation (i.e. “corporeal/material depths,” “body without organs,” “schizophrenia”) to the “secondary organization” of sense (i.e. “the aleatory point,” “univocal being,” “empty form of time”) (46). At the stage of sense, dynamic genesis gives way to static genesis because

sense is not, like the mixture of bodies in depth, defined by movement, but by time, and specifically by ‘the empty form of time’ which Deleuze describes elsewhere, following Kant, as the form of everything that changes, but which does not itself change. It is, therefore, static (24).

Like its dynamic antecedent, static genesis is given different nominations in Anti-Oedipus and Difference and Repetition (“social production” and “differenciation-individuation,” respectively) in Hughes’s schema, but across all three texts and all three semantic fields, static genesis gives way to a “tertiary order,” the third and final level of genetic constitution. This is the level of “propositional consciousness” in Logic of Sense, of “molar objectivities” in Anti-Oedipus, and of “representation” in Difference and Repetition — all corollaries for the natural attitude that the regressive approach purports to bracket before moving backwards through the entire series.

Here and elsewhere, Hughes’s willingness to see through the implications of his reading is not only admirable but ethical. Among so many summaries of Deleuze’s work, Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation is so much more than a summary: in seeking to revise our sense of Deleuze, Hughes consistently pursues a phenomenological line of reasoning to its logical ends. And yet, it’s at these very junctures, when his rigor is so impressive, that we are liable to feel the uneasy consequences of a project to render Deleuze systematically. For instance, in the discussion of Anti-Oedipus, Hughes argues that Deleuze and Guatarri are not actually “speaking of history or of Marx” (98) but are rather elaborating a chapter in the constitution of genesis. Even if this text concerns the question of genesis, it’s hard to reconcile the polyvalences of Deleuze’s philosophy with the notion that with Hughes’s suggestion that the "language of psychoanalysis and Marxism that the authors employ [in Anti-Oedipus] needs to be rigorously ignored" (98). If this is what an account of genesis demands (and we’re by no means ready to grant as much), perhaps we ought to question the value of genesis itself — or, even more profoundly, perhaps we ought to consider genesis itself as a question of language, of style.

It’s in this regard, after all, that Deleuze begins Difference and Repetition by declaring that modern philosophy consists in “the search for new means of philosophical expression.”3 As Deleuze says elsewhere, it would be utterly bizarre to think that “philosophers have no style”4 — but this is precisely what Hughes bids us to do with respect to Deleuze. How, finally, are we to understand this? The philosophical denigration of philosophical style only begins to make sense when we see it as a matter of precedence: expression suffers whenever philosophy orients itself around the pre-existence of presuppositions and the apriority of knowledge because, by rights, these form the ground next to which writing itself is secondary (i.e., mannerism). Whence the overarching and paradoxical merit of Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation, which has so rigorously determined the nature of genesis as to reveal not only the actual and heuristic advantages of a phenomenological account but its virtual limits, beyond which the singular and impersonal work of thinking and writing remains profoundly unaccountable: in a word — outside.

1 Gilles Deleuze, Desert Island and Other Texts (1953-1974), trans. Mike Taormina (New York: Semiotexte, 2003), pg. 77.

2 Ibid.

3 Gilles Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, trans. Paul Patton (New York: Columbia UP, 1995), pg. xxi.

4 Gilles Deleuze, Negotiations, 1972-1990, trans. Martin Joughin (New York: Columbia UP, 1997), pg. 100.