Deleuze and the History of Mathematics: In Defense of the "New"

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Simon B. Duffy, Deleuze and the History of Mathematics: In Defense of the "New", Bloomsbury, 2013, 210pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441129505.

Reviewed by Aden Evens, Dartmouth College


Simon Duffy builds his layered arguments progressively, offering increasing dividends to the persistent reader. Roughly the first half of the text undertakes explanations of historical developments in mathematics and mathematical thinking that Gilles Deleuze draws upon to construct his philosophy, especially in The Fold, Difference and Repetition, and Bergsonism. These explanations -- of mathematical thought in Leibniz, Weierstrass, Poincaré, Maimon, Kant, Bergson, Riemann, Weyl, Lautman, and others -- are set forth with only occasional (though sometimes extended) reference to Deleuze, whose textual influences define the domain of discussion but whose writings do not for the most part direct the course of Duffy's argument.

Instead, the analysis proceeds according to a loose mathematical chronology, offering an extended response to the broad question of how the arguments and concepts of these mathematician-philosophers contribute to a "philosophy of difference," so that it is usually left to the reader to make explicit the lines of connection to Deleuze's texts. This is not a shortcoming of the book, but it does indicate the intended audience: those looking for remedial help reading Deleuze's incursions into mathematics should probably look elsewhere, as this book does not perform close readings of Deleuze, nor does it attempt to explain his mathematical references for English majors. Rather it traces in a selective history of mathematics a philosophy of difference and mostly avoids (or takes as understood) the constitutive formalisms of the referenced mathematics in figures, symbols, proofs, and the like.

As the text progresses it does not abandon its mission of support for Deleuze's philosophy, but the discussion shifts increasingly toward broader concerns about the relation between mathematics and philosophy, using the analyses of the opening chapters as illustrations and tests in the service of these metamathematical and sometimes metaphilosophical concerns. Thus the Deleuze-guided reading of the (partial) history of mathematics in the first three or four chapters of the book yields multiple results. It demonstrates Deleuze's significant and under-recognized debt to mathematics, offers diverse support to a philosophy of difference, shows the intimate alliance between (the histories of) mathematics and philosophy, and, as revealed in later chapters, models a particular kind of relation between philosophy and mathematics that Deleuze, modifying Lautman's philosophy of genesis in mathematics, generalizes to other disciplines.

Defending in the penultimate chapter Deleuze's project of philosophical engagement with mathematics, Duffy also asserts this model of a relation between philosophy and mathematics as a successful counterexample to Alain Badiou's insistence that philosophy can (or should) only take mathematics as foundational and so must begin with a foundationally oriented mathematics, such as the axiomatic set theory that underpins the analysis in his Being and Event. (Axiomatization responds to foundational questions by eliminating the conditions under which they can be posed; a system of axioms is an abstraction that makes no claim to a truth independent of that system but exhibits abstract characteristics that derive from the particular relations among its axioms, such as internal consistency or a certain degree of power as measured by what can be proved within that system.)

By contrast with Badiou's submission of philosophy to a quasi-Platonist mathematics, Deleuze's philosophical relation to mathematics does not seek mathematics as a philosophical foundation and, in fact, traces a lineage within mathematics that is relatively unconcerned with mathematical foundation. Deleuze's mathematical thematic tends to disregard foundational questions, instead drawing inspiration from the paradoxical tension between the historical specificity of mathematical developments and the unique status of mathematical objects as ideal and universal. For Duffy and for his Deleuze, mathematics must not resolve the tension of its primary impetus by foreclosing the foundational question but must work from its own problematic epistemological and ontological status. (For Deleuze, as Duffy argues, this is true not just of mathematics but of every discipline, for the dialectical problem as genetic element, which comes from mathematics, conditions genesis or progress in all domains.)

Chapter One highlights Leibniz's mathematics, emphasizing the invention of the differential. Though Leibniz regards the differential as a fiction, it is foremost his demonstration of its legitimacy and value that draws Deleuze to his mathematics. For as Duffy explains, during the next couple of centuries the differential was chased out of mathematics for seeming fuzzy or too ill-defined to be real, though there was also an apologist lineage that attempted to save the differential by providing it with a proper rigor. (This rigorous differential was eventually established only in the twentieth century.) A differential, frequently exemplified as dx, is an infinitesimal, which for Leibniz and until the twentieth century resisted static definition; as something infinitely small it tends to be understood mathematically not as a fixed (and therefore clearly conceptualizable) entity but as a kind of process in which something (such as the numerator and denominator of a fraction or the distance between two points) gets successively smaller, "approaching 0." In the nineteenth century, Weierstrass, among others, provided a formalization in finitist terms, the epsilon-delta definition of limit, that appears to purge the calculus of the weirdness of the differential.

Though Weierstrass removed the need for the differential in the calculus, Duffy explains that his other contributions to mathematics nevertheless supported the "differential point of view" and so influenced Deleuze significantly, even shaping his conception of Leibniz's differentials. Working not only with points and lines but with surfaces and with maps from one surface to another, Weierstrass, like Leibniz, emphasizes a mathematical process of construction that starts with the local rather than the global, where local connections are determined in confrontation with singularities, points of radical disruption that hinder smooth transitions across a surface. Deleuze "redeploys" this mathematics as ontology, reading the mathematical dramatization of singularities and the ordinary points between them as descriptions of the genesis of qualities and objects in the world and of the relation between a subject and its predicates.

Duffy underlines the specificity and sophistication of Deleuze's mathematical borrowings, showing how Deleuze's readings of ontogenetic determination, incompossibility, and monadic distinction extend and strengthen Leibniz's metaphysics by supplementing it with concepts and techniques drawn from post-Leibnizian differential mathematics. Combining Weierstrass's local-to-global constructivism with further developments by Poincaré that emphasize intuitive and geometric methods, Duffy's Deleuze recovers a mathematical account of Leibniz's metaphysics where monads are particular varieties of singularity, and very specifically, where

The 'jump' of the variable across the domain of discontinuity between the poles of two analytic functions, which actualizes the Weierstrassian potential function in the infinite branches of the Poincaréan composite function, corresponds to what Leibniz refers to in his impulse account of accelerated motion as the unextended 'leap' made by a body in motion from the end of one subinterval to the locus proximus, the indistant but distinct beginning point of the next interval, which marks a change in the direction and velocity of the moving body. (43)

 This kind of correspondence between mathematical concepts or gestures (a variable that "jumps" between singular points) and philosophical concepts (Leibniz's metaphysical account of the motion of a body) exemplifies Duffy's presentation of the Deleuzian approach to bringing mathematics to bear on philosophy, and this approach of structural correspondence itself finds a metamathematical model in the writings of Lautman as described in Chapter Four.

The second and third chapters examine Deleuze's other major mathematical influences, showing again how his philosophical concepts correspond to mathematical entities and relations or to mathematical and metamathematical gestures. As with Deleuze's retrospective reading of Leibniz through the later mathematics of Weierstrass and Poincaré, Deleuze's Kant as analyzed in Chapter Two also constructs his metaphysics around a mathematics that must be modified in light of Maimon's reformulation of Kant's ideas. Similarly, the Riemann of Chapter Three provides for Bergson a mathematical justification for his central notion of duration, but Deleuze carries this project farther, bringing more of Riemann's mathematics to bear in his interpretation of Bergson, in part through his familiarity with Weyl's extensions of Riemann's work. The mathematical themes at issue in these chapters are cousins to those of Chapter One, including questions around continuity and discontinuity, the nature of the infinite and infinitesimal, the ontological status of mathematical entities, the mathematics of space and time, the hierarchy between differentiation and integration, the solvability of problems in mathematics, and the problematic character of the differential. This rich variety of mathematical material allows Duffy to connect a lot of dots, providing math-historical correspondences for such prominent Deleuzian concepts as multiplicity, problematics, and different/ciation.

The study of Lautman's influence on Deleuze in the fourth chapter marks a transition between the two parts of the book. Duffy continues here as in the early chapters to articulate correspondences between (Lautman's) metamathematical structures and Deleuze's "redeployment" of these schemas in his philosophy, but Lautman is not so much doing mathematics as commenting on how mathematics is done. Thus the discussion begins to shift from specific onto-epistemological analyses derived from particular mathematical concepts toward general considerations about how mathematics (and other fields) progress, the relationship between mathematics and the real, the relationship between mathematical performance and mathematical thought, and other metamathematical and philosophical concerns. Lautman develops a notion of mathematical genesis in which mathematics only advances in the context of a mathematical milieu -- the mathematical real -- which does not necessarily enter the formal mathematics but which provides the conditions under which problems can form and so engender attempts at (formal) mathematical solution. Problems arise out of the tensions among different mathematical subdomains and the desire to reconcile their perspectives, a metamathematical version of the mathematical problems of continuity addressed in the first three chapters. Taking a cue from Lautman himself, Deleuze modifies and generalizes this account of disciplinary progress, locating problems and their dialectical specification as the immanent condition of the production of solutions across disciplines and not only within mathematics.

Following a chapter on Badiou's mathematics and on the inefficacy of his critique of Deleuze, the "Conclusions" chapter might be called "Parting Shots," as it rebuts some criticisms of the author's previous work and launches a few preemptive strikes as well. These closing thoughts are instructive but would feel more conclusive if framed within the broadest concerns of the book. The text reorients its tone to encompass bigger themes in the last few paragraphs, which offer helpful summary statements of the book's claims, but the bulk of the final chapter, rhetorically addressed at individual commentators, reinforces the unfortunate sense of a rather narrow audience for this monograph, as though Duffy and the other members of the Deleuze-and-math club are fighting it out in a battle of hardcover texts.

The subtitle, In Defense of the "New," receives little explicit attention in the text but comes to the fore in Duffy's response to Badiou in Chapter Five. Duffy contends that his reading of Deleuze preserves in "the model" an important distinction between the merely reconfigured and the genuinely novel, which corresponds to the mathematical distinction between analytic transformations of Riemann surfaces (something like a shift of perspective) versus Poincaré's technique of constructing new Riemann surfaces around essential singularities that establish distinctions in kind from the previous surfaces (something like irreconcilable perspectives). This "defense of the new" as a distinction preserved in a specific mathematical model illustrates both the great strength and the potential risk of Duffy's approach. For the isomorphic relation between the philosophical concept of newness and the mathematical concept of a composite surface derived from essential singularities provides a definitive response to the question of the place of newness in Deleuze's philosophy. But in so doing, it pins the discussion to a mathematical discourse, leaving little room for the overdetermination and expansiveness that characterize Deleuze's philosophical concepts and his general method.

Though Duffy too participates in Deleuzian overdetermination, providing multiple definitions (and multiple mathematical correspondents) for key terms like singularity and multiplicity, his readings tend to calm the roiling of Deleuze's concepts and shrink the penumbra of connections around them in Deleuze's philosophy, even while forging some new ones. The restriction to mathematical territory means that there is no discussion of ethics or politics here, beyond the ethics of how to incorporate mathematics into philosophy. The sciences, closely tied to mathematics and of great moment in Deleuze's work, get barely a mention. And while Duffy thoroughly details Deleuze's engagements with mathematics as "redeployments" of mathematical structures within philosophy, he offers strangely sparse commentary on what brings these many mathematical ideas together in Deleuze, leaving the highly apposite question of nomadism and nomad science, for instance, to future research. Even the prose style has a mathematical tinge to it, as relentlessly declarative sentences reveal their highly organized structures through comma splicing and repeated technical phrases.

But these omissions are hardly damning given how well this book succeeds at its stated aims. Along with the philological excavation of Deleuze's mathematical influences, which manifest the philosophy of difference, Duffy also demonstrates and defends a model of mathematical philosophy, one that he finds in Deleuze but proposes to extend indefinitely. Rejecting the foundationalism of Badiou's formula, "mathematics is ontology," Deleuze and the History of Mathematics discloses another meaning for this formula, one that begins not from foundations but already au milieu, presenting the potential indistinction of mathematics and philosophy as the open, productive, and proper relation between them.