Deleuze and the Naming of God: Postsecularism and the Future of Immanence

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Daniel Colucciello Barber, Deleuze and the Naming of God: Postsecularism and the Future of Immanence, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 220pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748686360.

Reviewed by Joshua Ramey, Grinnell College


Over the last decade there has been an explosion of scholarship on the philosophy of Gilles Deleuze. Unfortunately much of this work amounts to attempts simply to deploy or apply Deleuze's concepts to various fields, rather than to test where Deleuze's thoughts may still remain unfinished or even in need of substantial emendation. Contrasting with this recent glut of sometimes thoughtless orthodoxy, Daniel Colucciello Barber's book is an incisive return to core concepts in Deleuze's thought in order to interrogate and re-express them differently.

Anyone not working in contemporary continental philosophy of religion may be surprised or bemused by references to "the naming of God" and to "postsecularism" in the title of a book about Deleuze. Rightly or wrongly, most serious readers of Deleuze have been either uninterested in theology or else so inimical to it that they have lacked either the erudition or the investment to truly appreciate the polemic with Christian theology that Deleuze's thought might instigate, and the creative religious thought it might spawn as an alternative.[1]

If and when Deleuze invokes the name of God, it is generally in the context of his debt to Spinoza (or occasionally Leibniz). Most of Deleuze's explicit references to Christianity, on the other hand, have a Nietzschean inspiration, and because Barber's book is primarily a polemic with Christian theology, it is with Nietzsche that Barber begins. But Barber shows that Deleuze's engagement with theology, while indebted to Nietzsche, goes beyond it in crucial and constructive ways. In Barber's hands, Deleuze's critique of Christian theology forms the organon of a very different appreciation of what it might mean to name God, and of what it might mean to claim to be "post-secular."

What is remarkable about Barber's work, not only here but also in many of his other essays, is the way in which he is simultaneously able to criticize, from an extremely sophisticated ethical and political point of view, the majoritarian and authoritarian tendencies in Christian theology while simultaneously revealing minoritarian tendencies that are subversive, radical, and refuse what for Barber is the key weakness of Christian theology, namely its sometimes explicit but often covert attempt at theodicy, the justification of the sufferings of the world. More than the Nietzschean theme of ressentiment and the triumph of slave morality, it is Deleuze's attack on the transcendent mode of Christian discourse and piety, and his affirmation of immanence, that Barber weaponizes against all theodicy. In what follows I will try to summarize exactly how and why Deleuze's thought can, in Barber's hands, be used to undermine and provide an alternative to theodicy.

But it needs to be emphasized that for Barber the deep critique of Christianity in Deleuze's thought becomes weaponized not in the name of non-religious, disenchanted, or more-fully-secularized modes of thought and culture, but for the creation of a new, strategic use of religious discourse (or a differently religious use of discourse) in a mode of what Barber calls "fabulation." Partly because, as I write these words, Israel is in the process of bombing, mutilating, and murdering Palestinian civilians in the name of its supposedly threatened security, but also because Palestine is the case that Deleuze himself used to explain what he meant by the political importance of fabulation, or "telling tales," I want to quote a few sentences of Barber's prose, to let his text speak for itself on this point. Barber writes,

The sense of the fable emerges through a construction of the senselessness of experience. It is for this reason that a suffering people will often enter into resistance through fabulation. In this regard, Deleuze notes [in the Negotiations interviews of the early 1990's] the example of Palestinian resistance.

Was there ever a Palestinian people? Israel says no. Of course there was, but that's not the point. The thing is, that once the Palestinians have been thrown out of their territory, then to the extent that they resist they enter the process of creating a people. It corresponds to . . . the act of telling tales. It's how any people is constituted.

The immense value of fabulation lies in the fact that it exceeds any correlational model of truth. One says, making use of Deleuze's example, that there is no Palestinian people. How is the truth of such a proposition decided? It cannot be decided by reference, for the field of reference is itself decided by present conditions of possibility. And if one wishes to refute the decision of the present, it does not suffice to refer to past history, for the present is certainly able to provide its own narration of the historical past. . . . Fabulation, then, does not aim to correlate with the present or with the history told by the present. It opposes the presently associated elements through the creation of new relations, which supplant the preconditions of correlation. Fabulation, because it creates such relations, produces real beings. (202)

What if there were a Palestinian people? What would follow from such a proposition? It does not matter if there actually is a Palestinian people whose existence is denied by others. If that denial forms the basis of actuality, then the truth of Palestine can only be non-actual, fictional. But this then becomes powerful. To believe that there might be such a people -- to truly, that is to say actively and even militantly, believe in that tale -- would be to act as if there were such a people. Such belief, causing real effects, thus causes reality to come into being on the basis of a fiction, a fable, a tale. It's worth noting, here, that in Plato's Laws the most important basis of the social order is not kept in the minds of the rationalistic guardians, but in the legendary traditions of the pious elders, in some sense responsible sustaining the tale through re-telling it and through the maintenance of continuous ritual re-enactment. While Plato turns this point to conservative use, one can see that he recognizes the grounding of politics in fabulation.

But what, then, is specifically "religious" or "post-secular" about fabulation, and how does Deleuze's thinking lead us to an alternate use of God's name or to the creative usage of religious discourse and figures? To attempt to disinter from theological materials a point of view that subverts the aims of theodicy was something Deleuze himself was either unwilling or unable explicitly to do, at least not anywhere near the detail to which Barber takes this task. (Deleuze merely hints in some places that there are ways in which Christian theology appreciates the radicality of immanence only to suppress it through hierarchical schemas of emanation. The point of Barber's book is to take up this task explicitly -- that is, to use Deleuze's conception of immanence as a way of re-expressing the political potency of the name of God, beyond its conscription into any pre-ordained program of analogical anticipation.

For Barber, to dare or risk using the name of "God" after Spinoza, after Nietzsche, and after Deleuze, is to become truly post-secular. If "the secular" is that which supersedes and thus de-legitimates the religious, then to use the name of God after secularism is not so much to recover religion (let alone Christianity), but to re-imagine or re-express what religious language and ideas might be, or might have been, but had thus far been unable to express. What is at stake here, for Barber, is not in any sense the "recovery" or renewal of constituted, available forms of religious belief and practice, but precisely the subversive opportunity presented by re-claiming the name of God in a secular age. This opportunity is not so much a chance to re-ignite religious devotion as it is to detach or de-link from the world, where even "the secular" world is understood, in Deleuzian terms, as a set of constituted actualities that are set to deny their contingent and arbitrary status. This self-defensiveness of the actual (secular, as much as actual Christianity) is the ethical and political problem at the heart of Barber's work. The name of such self-defensiveness, traditionally, has been "theodicy," the justification of the ways of God to humanity.

Barber's key Deleuzian theme in his attack on theodicy is the vexed and ambiguous term "immanence." Christian theology has typically opposed the transcendence of God, specifically of God's providential grace and salvific operations, to the immanence of the world taken as a seemingly self-sufficient principle (including the principles of finitude and death). Thus the affirmation of "immanence" in traditional theological terms amounts to atheism, to a world without God, without meaning, without salvation. But, as Barber points out, Deleuze's strategic use of the term "immanence" cannot be captured by this opposition. On Barber's reading, for Deleuze "immanence" only names a structural invariant of existence to the extent that suffering forms the existential basis of awareness of the world, or better relation to the actual world, through or by a creative, fabulating capacity.

At the level of actual existence, of constituted selves and groups, the discord of existence can be dealt with either by attempting to resolve it by analogy with previous accords, or by attending to it on its own terms. Christian theology tends to take the first path, most typically by reference to the figure of Christ as the one who suffers once for all and thus forms the analogical basis for the inherent meaning and promise of all suffering. The second path, taken by Deleuze, is one that refuses all analogy. This path is riddled with paradox, since without analogy there are no "terms" or "tones" emitted by the rupture or fissure in existence -- it is an anti-thetical term or noise. But the ethical, political, (and in some sense aesthetic) opportunity here is for existence to refuse to anticipate what suffering can mean, and on that basis existence may become something it never was. (It should be noted, here, that for Barber this reading of Deleuze allies him both to Theodor Adorno and to the radical Christian socialist thinker John Howard Yoder, each of whom receives a chapter-length treatment in Barber's book).

For Barber, "immanence" in Deleuze names a certain fractured or disjoint character of existence, a kind of fissure or differential that is radically unconditioned and that conditions both the actual and the virtual, as well as their interplay or relay. In very general terms, for Deleuze actualities are limitations on or limited variants of virtual potencies or tendencies that are in principle unlimited. But both the virtual and the actual are subject to radical contingency, that is to say conditioned by a kind of hiatus or stammering, a fundamental disaccord that is not simply a temporary disharmony caused by unaffiliated elements or by the incomplete process of forming an actual whole. Rather, immanence is a fundamental dis-accord or discord that is related, enigmatically, both to the truly unpredictable nature of the future and to the reality of existential suffering. It is this key link of immanence to suffering that Barber accentuates in a way that perhaps no other reader of Deleuze has yet done.

To summarize, this is Barber's argument. For the Christian theologian, the violence that is germane to existence, and the suffering it portends, are contingent effects of a contingent fallen state of creation, a state that has, but might not have, eventuated from the divine dispensation of creation. On this view, suffering is temporary, and thus can be redeemed as passing. Crucial to this view, however, is that suffering can be redeemed because the future toward which existence as such is oriented was present in the original act of creation. The future is important because it re-actualizes the past, or what was in the beginning (is now and ever shall be). Suffering, then, is simply a mark or feature of the waiting or the temporal passing of the fallen world into its redeemed state. In this sense being as such is unintelligible unless it is marked by transcendence, a transcendence that redeems existence from its apparent entrapment in the "immanence" of the fallen world.

This equivalence between immanence and the principles of a fallen world is precisely what causes theology to mischaracterize the very different significance of immanence. What is immanent for Deleuze, Barber argues, is not the actuality of violence, suffering, and evil that mark the world such as it was, or is, or seems to be (from a fallen perspective). Rather, what is immanent for Deleuze is the differential or re-expressive character of being, as such, a power never clearly (though always fully) reflected neither in the actual nor in the virtual, since both of these dimensions are radically contingent and unforeseeable (the actual constantly changes and the virtual constantly re-expresses itself differently in the actual). Immanence in this way has to do with the radical unforseeability of the future, the radical contingency of the world, and the suffering in both our creative opening to and resentful denial of the future.

The argument with theology, therefore, is not so much about God as it is about the nature of the future. For Deleuze, the future is produced through a certain perspective on suffering that is creative, and this is named "immanence." Any future that is a genuine future, on this view, is disjunct with the present, which means that the present cannot communicate with that future on its own terms. Traditionally, theology deals with the future in terms of analogy. The reality of the future, in absolute terms, must be analogous with being as it has been and is. And God must be the final or eminent term of all analogical reasoning, such that whatever is or has been good, in the past or present, will in the future be known to be (and experienced as) the goodness of God.

But, Barber argues, if analogy is a theory of how judgments (or more generally discourse, communication) are grounded in being, analogy is inadequate to characterize the future. It can only pre-script the future, forcing it to replicate what Barber calls "given accords." It is not that Deleuze does not long for ultimate harmony or peace, along with anyone else who has suffered through life on earth. It is rather that, for Deleuze the names "harmony" or "peace," in order to address suffering, must, like the name "God" itself, not even refer (analogically or otherwise) to the world that demands or produces suffering. In order to do this, suffering must not be seen as something that wants to be named or addressed, but as something that wants to make new names, evoke new addresses and addressees. Suffering wants to make a new world, not to redeem the world.

As Barber elegantly puts it,

Immanence thus turns on ethics, on the decision to either become-minor or become-major, to affirm the crack that runs through all individuals or to refuse it in the name of the given accords. Suffering is a fact, it is what there is, or what is given. Yet suffering, and all the violence that it undergoes and can engender, need not be the last word on what is possible. Suffering, when it is affirmed through an ethics of the crack, may open onto new possibilities. Suffering can give way to becoming. (95)

What becoming minor or minoritarian means is to stop pretending that one's individuality is not marked by a radical difference, a difference that cannot be harmonized with others in the world such as it is. The refusal to accept the terms of harmonization such as they are available in the actual world is to affirm one's difference, not as an as-yet-unrecognized identity, but as an Unrecognizable that no longer needs or wants recognition, but wants to make a world unknown.

[1] Exceptions to this include the groundbreaking work of Philip Goodchild (both in Gilles Deleuze and the Question of Philosophy as well as in his more recent Capitalism and Religion: The Price of Piety, and Theology of Money), Kristien Justaert (Theology After Deleuze) and the contributors to SubStance 39.2, "Spiritual Politics After Deleuze." Along with Christian Kerslake (Deleuze and the Unconscious, Immanence and the Vertigo of Philosophy), I have also tried to explore different or unexpected religious potentialities in Deleuze's thought by highlighting the importance of esoteric traditions in Deleuze's thinking, in The Hermetic Deleuze: Philosophy and Spiritual Ordeal).