Deleuze and World Cinemas

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David Martin-Jones, Deleuze and World Cinemas, Continuum, 2011, 270pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780824636429.

Reviewed by Robert Sinnerbrink, Macquarie University, Sydney


David Martin-Jones' admirable new book achieves something rare in the proliferating field of Deleuzian philosophy of film: an original study that is both critical and creative, an intervention in the "film as philosophy" debate that is at once theoretical and historical. Instead of dutifully applying Deleuzian concepts to a predictable corpus of films (those discussed in Deleuze's Cinema I: The Movement-Image and Cinema II: The-Time Image[1]), Martin-Jones challenges Deleuze's philosophy of cinema via historically and culturally contextualized readings of a variety of case studies in "world cinemas": Spaghetti Westerns, Argentine melodrama, South Korean time-travel movies, Michael Mann's LA crime thrillers, and popular Indian (Bollywood) cinema.

In this regard, Martin-Jones develops a welcome critical approach to Deleuzian film philosophy, questioning in particular Deleuze's "Eurocentrism": his extrapolation from the history of American and European cinematic traditions to a general thesis on the post-war "crisis of the action image" heralding the "modern" cinema of time. At the same time, Martin-Jones is committed to developing the potential of Deleuzian film philosophy by extending it to a plurality of global cinema traditions, which develop hybrid forms of movement- and time-image narrative as well as introduce novel types of image (for example, what Martin-Jones calls the "attraction-image," drawing on work from early cinema emphasizing spectacle and sensation rather than narrative and action). Deleuze and World Cinemas avoids abstract generalities in favor of detailed film analyses, demonstrating how philosophically significant claims -- in this case, understanding "the continued relevance of Deleuze's work in a global context" (p. 6) -- can be developed out of detailed engagement with films themselves.

The book begins with a lucid Introduction outlining Martin-Jones' argumentative approach: to question the limits of Deleuzian film philosophy through its encounter with culturally and generically complex films that force a rethinking of the movement-image/time-image distinction. Deleuze and World Cinemas thus develops historically contextualized and culturally nuanced film readings that counter the prevailing tendency in Deleuzian film studies to conceptualize particular films without due attention to their context of production and consumption or their distinctive cultural and aesthetic traditions. Instead, Martin-Jones argues for a contextualist approach to Deleuze's work as a way of doing justice to the plural and hybrid ("rhizomatic") character of world cinemas today. Can the "Eurocentrism" of Deleuze's film philosophy be overcome? Addressing this question is essential, Martin-Jones maintains, if Deleuze's work is to remain relevant in a global cinematic milieu (p. 7).

Martin-Jones was one of the first to have made this kind of criticism, which has dogged Deleuzian film philosophy in recent years.[2] What is distinctive aboutDeleuze and World Cinemas, however, is the manner in which this criticism is made and the conclusions that are drawn from it. Chapter One, "The Attraction-Image: From George Méliès to the Spaghetti Western," confronts Deleuze's neglect of the early "cinema of attractions" (early pre-narrative and silent cinema) along with marginal genres like the Spaghetti Western (low-budget Italian-Spanish co-productions of the 1970s with spectacular violence and intriguing political subtexts). In both early cinema and the Spaghetti Western, Jones argues, there are images that do not appear in Deleuze's exhaustive taxonomy of image types: rather than classical "action-images" we find distinctive "attraction-images" that emphasize spectacle over perception or action. Attraction-images, in turn, are interpolated in these films so as to interrupt montage-driven narrative sequencing, creating "non-continuous" wholes that thwart the classical action-driven myths of nationhood. Despite appearances, such films open up a space for the critical exploration of broader cultural-political themes -- for example, American post-war economic and cultural influence (in Django) and the cycles of political violence experienced by subaltern populations during the Cold War (in Keoma) (p. 24).

Martin-Jones' philosophical target here is twofold: Deleuze's historical starting point in Cinema I, which commences with D.W. Griffiths' use of montage to construct a narrative cinema expressing an "organic whole" correlated with a nationalist vision of American "manifest destiny"; and Deleuze's underlying commitment to a Bergsonian metaphysics of duration, which prompts him to narrate the story of cinema's development by privileging the role of montage in driving the (indirect) temporal expression of narrative film as composing a movement-image whole. Contra both claims, as Martin-Jones points out, early cinema had already developed a type of movement-image, the attraction-image, well before the advent of montage-driven narrative cinema, whereas Deleuze's emphasis on montage (as expressing a sensory-motor/action-based form of narrative) overlooks the importance of spectacle and nascent time-images in what Tom Gunning has called the early "cinema of attractions" (pp. 37-39). Retrieving the importance of attraction-images and spectacle as interruption, he argues, opens up a more expansive conception of how early cinema and the Spaghetti Western deploy alternative image-types -- expressing visual spectacle, for example -- that allow for "non-continuous" forms of narrative expression (pp. 36-43). The latter, in turn, foster the kind of slackening or interruption of classical sensory-motor action schemas that are conducive to challenging the mythic narrative of origins evident in many traditional Westerns and historical-action dramas.

Martin-Jones makes his case here via detailed readings of two fascinating Spaghetti Westerns, Sergio Corbucci's Django (1966) and Enzo G. Castellari's Keoma(1976). Far from being mere imitations, the Spaghetti Westerns use discontinuous attraction-images to open up a space of critical encounter between the mythic character of the American Western (heroic individual action meets historical "manifest destiny") and the post-colonialist rewriting of that myth as a political critique of American post-war imperialist violence afflicting colonised peoples across the globe.

This political strain of critique is developed further in Martin-Jones' chapters on history and cinema, Chapter Two on Argentine melodrama and Chapter Three on South Korean time travel movies. He elaborates compelling contextualist readings of these films as extending Deleuze's emphasis on the historico-political conditions of the "crisis in the action image" that precipitated the post-war shift from movement-image to time-image cinema. He thereby criticises Deleuze's "universalization" of the historically specific case of European (and American) cinema as undergoing a "crisis of the action image" in response to the traumatic upheavals of WWII (pp. 70-74). To take the latter as the historical threshold for the transition from a classical movement-cinema to a modern time-cinema, Martin-Jones argues, overlooks the fact that there are multiple historical instances of "crisis" cinema emerging in response to violent political upheaval within specific cultural and national contexts. Indeed, the Deleuzian "crisis of the action-image" is a cinematic response to specific historical and political circumstances that can co-exist with classical movement-image cinema in distinctive cultural variants (pp. 70-71).

Martin-Jones develops these claims by considering the cinematic response to history in the case of two rejuvenating national cinemas (Argentine and South Korean) emerging from periods of Cold War military rule (pp. 69ff.). Drawing on Deleuze's analysis of the figure of the child/seer in post-War Italian neo-realism, a witness to the historical disruption of inherited ways of seeing and acting, he analyses the way that the figure of the child in Argentine melodrama enables an exploration of the "repressed memory" of the past experienced during military dictatorship, most pointedly in the traumatic phenomenon of "disappearing" dissident individuals without warning or explanation.

Taking as a case study the Argentine melodrama Kamachtka (2002), set during the 1970s, Martin-Jones analyses with clarity and rigor how the figure of the child functions as a vehicle for reconstructing a national history under military rule. By setting the film in the past (the 1970s) and having the child as a witness to what hashappened (rather than a witness to what is happening in the present, as in Italian neo-realism), Kamachtka recreates the past for a generation of viewers who lived through that traumatic period, inviting them to recollect and meditate on those who were "disappeared," and hence to explore how the present generation might reconstruct a past that they lived through (individually) but could not (collectively) comprehend (pp. 74-82). This approach to Argentine melodramas of familial "disappearance" provides a counter-example to Deleuze's claim that it was the historical singularity of WWII that disrupted sensory-motor action narrative and opened up a new cinema of time. The point, rather, is that such disruption of received frameworks of perception, belief, and action can recur in variable historical, cultural, and political situations.

Another example is South Korean time-travel films, which "fold" disparate temporal dimensions in order to evoke a different way of understanding South Korea's disorienting cultural and historical experience of "compressed modernity" (pp. 108-110). While appearing to be straightforward action-driven science fiction, these films also foreground their status as cinematic works enacting a "folding" and "enfolding" of historical time and thus are capable of expressing an indirect image of the "outside": the compressed and conflicting historical experience of a nation undergoing profound economic, cultural, and political change (pp. 110-113). Both Argentine melodrama and Korean time-travel films challenge the received Deleuzian account of the transition from movement- to time-image cinema, which again underlines the need to acknowledge the multiple ways in which time and memory can be evoked in culturally and historically specific situations of political and social upheaval.

Chapter Four shifts genres to Hong Kong action film, focusing on Jackie Chan's Police Story [Ging chat goo si] (1985). It is the first of two chapters dealing with the deployment of what Deleuze calls "any-space-whatevers in the construction of urban milieus" (p. 133). Martin-Jones updates Deleuze's account of the "any-space-whatever" (derived from the deracinated urban spaces appearing out of the rubble of post-war Europe) to the contemporary dislocated or anonymous globalized "non-places" of the slum and the shanty town, the shopping mall and the airport (pp. 134-140). The pure optical and sound situations generated by these urbanised "any-space-whatevers" break up sensory-motor, action-driven narrative dynamics; but they also anticipate the kind of cinema of the "seer" -- rather than of the actor -- that expresses a whole of time (and place) that is mutating, conflicted, culturally "out of joint" (pp. 141-145).

In Police Story, according to Martin-Jones, this is manifested in the famous opening sequence of a spectacular car chase cutting a swathe through a shanty town (the corrupt corporate villain literally destroying the town in making his getaway) and Jackie Chan's spectacular shopping-mall stunts (during which the mall as space of consumption is virtually destroyed) (pp. 147-160). Both sequences signal allegorically the film's cultural critique of the destructive impact of globalization on the local Hong Kong community, with Chan's spectacular, stylised "fightbacks" celebrating how the subaltern local hero triumphs over a corrupted global order (pp. 160-161). Martin-Jones' post-colonial reading of Police Story thus challenges Deleuze's implicit dismissal of the action film as a genre incapable of serious ideological or cultural critique. On the contrary, Chan's action thrillers stage a spectacular confrontation, via action and martial arts drama, with a globalised social, economic, and urban space in transition.

The potential for action film to stage implicit forms of critique is extended further in Chapter Five, which shifts tack geographically and generically to consider Michael Mann's LA crime thrillers, Heat (1995) and Collateral (2004). Increasingly recognized as an emerging Hollywood auteur, Mann's sophisticated thrillers reveal, in Martin-Jones' hands, subtle geopolitical dimensions via their pointed use of the any-space-whatevers of Los Angeles: spatio-temporal expressions of a dislocated global city riven by conflicting economic and social vectors (pp. 169-174). Mann's urbanized any-space-whatevers -- airports, container ports, the cityscape as sea of coloured lights -- combined with action-images cross-bred with "crystalline" (pure optical and sound) description, present LA as a "global gateway city"; a complex urbanised milieu in which radical inequalities of wealth, conflicting forms of professionalism ("cops and robbers"), entrepreneurial and criminal elements co-exist in ambivalent relations of mutual transformation and global exchange (pp. 171-174).

Martin-Jones' most original reworking of Deleuze's Cinema books comes in his final chapter, which examines popular Indian ("Bollywood") film as a counterexample to Deleuze's neglect of culturally diverse, generically hybrid cinema. He coins the term "masala-image" to capture the eclecticism of traditions, dramatic conventions, and cultural horizons evident in contemporary Bollywood musicals, which rework Indian mythic narrative (derived from the Ramayana andMahabharata) while also sourcing an alternative cultural-metaphysical (dharmic) conception of a normatively ordered cosmic and social whole (pp. 211-215). Martin-Jones' contextualist rereading of Bollywood thus serves to question the very basis of Deleuze's distinction between movement-image and time-image cinema: for Bollywood cinema confounds the claim that these designate discrete image-types composing distinct regimes of narrative cinema. Such films rest in any case on a culturally-inflected metaphysics that maintains a mythical link between social and cosmic orders governed by the principle of dharma. As such, they destabilize, Martin-Jones claims, the universality of Deleuze's (Bergsonian) philosophical conception of time and movement in his two Cinema books.

Deleuzian readers may be left wondering what remains of Deleuze's philosophy of film after Martin-Jones' thoroughly post-colonialist critique. Acknowledging the dialectic at play in his argument, Martin-Jones describes his position as "aDeleuzian," meaning both "non-Deleuzian" and "another" Deleuzianism: a perspective that maintains fidelity to the maître à penser precisely through critical transformation of his thought. One question such a reader might raise is whether Martin-Jones' strongly contextualist readings of these films strains the (culturally-historically transformed) Deleuzian conceptual framework in which they are situated. Deleuze's Bergsonian theses on movement and time (as expressed in different types of cinematic images) are intended as general metaphysical claims concerning different ways of conceptualizing time and movement; Martin-Jones' historicist and culturalist criticisms target the Eurocentricism of Deleuze's taxonomy of cinematic images and narrative regimes, as well as his underlying Bergsonian metaphysics, arguing that these bias Deleuze philosophically in favor of Western cinematic traditions.

The question is whether this criticism implies that Deleuze's Bergsonian "system" of cinema is therefore inadequate or incomplete (neglects spectacle, generic hybridity, cultural difference, and so on) or whether it is undermined tout court by its universalization of (Western) cinematic traditions. The former criticism depends upon accepting most of Deleuze's philosophical (Bergsonian) assumptions, whereas the latter undermines these foundations and leaves the theoretical basis of such a critique in doubt. Martin-Jones opts in the main for the former, though his rhetoric at times suggests the latter. If Deleuze's philosophy of cinema really does construct a "false universality" vitiated by Eurocentric bias, why persist with the Deleuzian detour in order to theorize specific cultural traditions of film?

Martin-Jones offers thoughtful rejoinders to this question, not least through the brilliance of his contextualist readings of a fascinatingly diverse array of films. Indeed, one of the most commendable aspects of Deleuze and World Cinemas is that it allows the films in question to "talk back" to Deleuze's Cinema books, which sometimes threaten to form the next "Grand Theory" claiming to account for everything pertaining to cinema. For these reasons, Martin-Jones' contextualist critique of Deleuzian film philosophy, which at once challenges and extends its limits, marks an important advance in contemporary film philosophy. Deleuze and World Cinemas shows remarkably well, moreover, what a genuinely pluralist Deleuzian film philosophy might look like.

[1] See Gilles Deleuze, Cinema I: The Movement-Image, trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986 [1983]; and Deleuze, Cinema II: The Time-Image, trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Robert Galatea, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989 [1985].

[2] See David Martin-Jones, Deleuze, Cinema and National Identity: Narrative Time in National Contexts, Edinburgh, Edinburgh University Press, 2006. For a philosophical criticism of Deleuze's distinction between movement-image and time-image cinema, see Jacques Rancière, Film Fables, trans. Emiliano Battista, Oxford/New York, Berg, 2006, pp. 107-123.