Deleuze Beyond Badiou: Ontology, Multiplicity, and Event

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Clayton Crockett, Deleuze Beyond Badiou: Ontology, Multiplicity, and Event, Columbia University Press, 2013, 232pp., $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231162692.

Reviewed by Jon Roffe, University of Melbourne


What do the readers of academic philosophy want? This question posed itself to me on more than one occasion as I read Clayton Crockett's enthusiastic comparative study, which presents itself as a rigorous and original account of Deleuze oriented by the superiority of his work over the philosophy of Badiou. Unfortunately, it is neither a helpful study of either thinker, nor a convincing argument for the 'beyond' of the title.

The two central problems of Crockett's book -- one at the level of rhetoric and the other at the level of content -- are perhaps best encapsulated in the following text, which sits near the middle of the book and acts as a hinge between ostensibly explicatory sections on Deleuze and Badiou respectively:

So I am taking a break from my presentation of Deleuze and returning to Badiou. This is a polemical book though, and thus I am unfair to Badiou's philosophy. But I am using it, and in particular Badiou's critique of Deleuze, as a foil against which to develop my interpretation of Deleuze. So I am not interested in presenting or appreciating Badiou on his own terms here, which does not mean that I don't appreciate or admire his thought. Quite the contrary. I want to engage Badiou's work more explicitly in this chapter and the following one, not to do justice to it, but to show in more detail how it is mostly incompatible with the understanding of Deleuze that I am assembling in this book. (104)

You would be forgiven, especially if you thought that Badiou's philosophy was worth at least the attention of careful reading, for finding in this short text enough evidence already not to engage with Crockett's book. At least the following questions arise: can an incompatibility between two thinkers be demonstrated on the basis of an explicitly falsifying method? Is a polemic really reducible to such a deliberate falsification? Why is it necessary to elaborate a fake Badiou in order to develop a reading of Deleuze (or anyone for that matter), in a strange transposition of ex falso quodlibet into the hermeneutic register? And what is one to make of the two chapters that follow this announcement, which are clearly an attempt to explicate Badiou's two major works, Being and Event and Logics of Worlds?

At the rhetorical level, note the strange mixture in this passage, which is moreover characteristic of the book throughout, of an abrupt personalism and a drifting form of non sequiturargumentation. This ubiquitous rhetorical modality, which is populated by clusters of rhetorical questions (above all at points in the book, like the close of Crockett's critical reading ofBeing and Event [119-20], where substantive argument is required) and marked by the frequent use of vague and imprecise propositions,[1] leaves the very distinct impression that very little can be concluded at all from Deleuze Beyond Badiou. I am tempted to speak of Crockett's rhetoric as the deployment of a form of sympathetic resonance, one which functions to partially stitch together analogical semblants on the surface of his discourse without any direct connection at the level of the logic of his argument. For example (a point I'll return to below) Crockett is drawn to the parallel between the notion of the mathematical sublime in Kant's third Critique and Badiou's mathematical ontology. Using this parallel, he elaborates a critical explication of Being and Event that manages to miss what Badiou means when he speaks of a mathematical ontology, while at the same time mistaking the sense of the adjective 'mathematical' in Kant. In other words, the argument functions at a kind of evocative secondary level, hovering above the texts it is concerned with without doing justice to either of them.

* * * * *

The book is divided into four sections. After a pair of chapters that aim to set up the confrontation, there is a section each devoted to summaries of Deleuze and Badiou respectively, while the final part, bearing the title of the book, presents three attempts to elaborate Deleuze's philosophy in the direction of contemporary physics, the politics-cinema connection, and an analysis of the socio-political situation in Haiti.

I have already noted that Crockett's rhetoric and the basic framework of his approach to Badiou seem to fatally compromise his engagement with the latter. His reading of Deleuze is certainly by no means as problematic. However, it too falls short of what a careful reader of Deleuze might hope to find. The three chapters of this part address Difference and RepetitionThe Logic of Sense, and the thematic of the event respectively. For Crockett, Deleuze's thought has three signal moments: its renewal of a serious philosophical engagement with the hard sciences (particularly physics and mathematics); a deeply revolutionary political thought that Deleuze uncovers in his engagement with the cinema, and which leads him to the notion of the people who are missing; and a differential ontology that converges on the concept of the event. All three of these important moments are certainly worth emphasizing, and these three chapters of Crockett's book, despite the problems I noted above alongside occasional misinterpretations, are admirable for doing so. Other virtues also accrue to this part of the book. For instance, his repeated emphasis throughout on the erroneous emphasis on the past and memory in Badiou's reading of Deleuze is very welcome. Not only has this claim (found in many quarters) led to an overvaluation of the influence of Bergson, it has allowed for a spurious picture of the concept of the virtual to emerge that bears little relation to the structuralism with which Deleuze insistently affiliates it. It is also welcome to see the final chapter of Difference and Repetition begin to get its due. This is a chapter that has the immense benefit, given the last decade in particular of work on Deleuze's philosophy, of displacing the overwhelming emphasis on the theme of the virtual itself in Deleuze's system.

Unfortunately, these points do not make up for the lack of solid scholarly attention. Deleuze says at a number of points that writing about another philosopher constitutes an act of portraiture. Despite the positive features of Crockett's reading of Deleuze, it must be emphasized that the portrait he constructs is particularly impressionistic in character.

* * * * *

Ultimately though, it is Badiou who is most poorly served by Crockett. The two chapters that form the second part of the book devoted to his work are ostensibly explications ofBeing and Event on the one hand and the couple of Logics of World and Theory of the Subject on the other. However, neither chapter manages to present a particularly accurate picture of Badiou's work. This review is not the place to enumerate the interpretive errors that can be identified here -- such a list being, in any case, no real grounds for dismissing a book. Two cases though seem emblematic.

I noted above that Crockett makes use of a questionable connection between Kant's sense of the term 'mathematical' in the third Critique and Badiou's claim in Being and Event that ontology is mathematics. This is based on certainly the most striking reading of Kant's discussion of the beautiful and the sublime I have ever encountered. Unfortunately, it is surprising solely because it so dramatically ignores what Kant actually wrote in favour of the kinds of free-associative conceptualizing I have already spoken of. The claim that, on Kant's view, "for any experience to be determined as sublime, it must also be dynamical, even if it is also mathematical," (115) might be taken as a clever send-up of a certain academic patois, were it not clearly intended to be an incisive reading and critique of a Kantian mainstay. But Crockett's actual argument is more striking yet again: that Badiou's ontology is a revision of Kant's doctrine of the mathematical sublime. He writes that "Badiou strips out the mathematical sublime from its moorings in the dynamical sublime and its conflict of the mental faculties. His mathematical ontology is essentially a variety of the mathematical sublime purged of dynamic subjectivity." (115) Leaving aside the infelicities contained here, the ambiguous grammar and terminological confusion, this has no purchase on Badiou's thought in any way, and its very presentation shows an elementary and widespread misunderstanding of the latter's project. The marriage of Kant and Badiou here has a truly grotesque silhouette. For instance, Crockett makes the multiply incorrect, deeply bewildering and even nonsensical claim that "The event surpasses ontology, which is Badiou's name for what Kant calls understanding, although it conforms to reason, which is Kant's name for what Badiou calls philosophy. Imagination is incapable of thinking or producing the event." (117) There are at least four errors here:

1) for Badiou, the event is what is irreducible to the order of being, but at least its form can be schematized ontologically (through the matheme of the event: ex={x∈X, ex});

2) for Badiou ontology is mathematics in its historical deployment, whereas the understanding is for Kant constitutive faculty that provides the conceptual structure for all objective knowledge claims – the two are thus in no way analogous, let alone the same thing with two different names;

3) correlatively, reason is for Kant the regulative faculty of Ideas which provides the problematizing – i.e., organizational – horizon that provides for the ultimate (in principle) coherence of knowledge and experience (a role that Deleuze analyses so well in Kant’s Critical Philosophy and Difference and Repetition). For Badiou, the central category of philosophy is Truth, and its goal is to demonstrate the compossibility of the various truths that are engendered by the four genres of truth procedure. Again, there is neither identity nor parallel here;

4) The final sentence in fact contains a bundle of errors: Being and Event never mentions imagination in any significant way, it is not at issue; Kant is not interested in ‘imagination’ but in ‘the imagination’ as the faculty that schematises the categories of the understanding; ‘thinking the event’ and ‘producing the event’ are strictly irreducible for Badiou; the latter is also nonsensical, events not being states of affairs that we can produce.

A second case is found in the following short text: "In Being and Event, Badiou claims that being qua being is mathematics, which is best expressed in terms of contemporary set theory." (107) Readers of Badiou have made a related error with unfortunate frequency, namely presuming him to be saying that being is mathematical, despite the fact that Badiou explicitly rejects such a view at the start of Being and Event (Introduction, 8). Crockett's claim is clearly erroneous to a greater degree again. Not only does Badiou say nothing of the sort, in Being and Event or elsewhere, what could it possibly mean for being as such to be the discipline of mathematics? This error is ramified by others that seem equally meaningless in the same chapter, for example the notion that, for Badiou and Quentin Meillassoux, "Mathematics is infinite rather than finite" (112) -- though it is unfortunately the case that peculiar mash-ups of mathematical terminology in particular can be found throughout the book. Consider, for example, the claim that “Badiou axiomatises being in order to allow for an event” (8) – being itself is not axiomatised by Badiou (what would it mean to axiomatise being itself?), it is rather that axiomatic set theory is the means we have to thinkbeing. Or this claim; “the notion of the asymptotic remainder is called topology” (127), which is analogous to asserting that the notion of a negative number is called arithmetic. In each of these, dramatic category errors are in play.

There is in sum neither enough of an appreciation of Badiou's philosophy, nor enough of what there is that is correct, to establish enough of a significant contrast with Deleuze to justify the titular project of Crockett's book. One might appreciate Crockett's antipathy towards Badiou's project in general, and his reading of Deleuze in particular, but it is truly depressing to see a genuine philosopher's work treated so poorly.

* * * * *

The final section consists of three rather disparate chapters. The first develops a reading of Deleuze oriented by the claim that "Being is energy transformation," (145) a claim as opaque though not as boggling as the one found on the next page: "We desperately need an athermal magnetoelectrodynamics, both in theory and in practice." (146) The sense of this claim is never quite given, though one might wonder if there could be any sense to a normative demand for a practical athermal magnetoelectrodynamics. Crockett provides us with a good deal of helpful discussion here of recent pop-scientific writing in contemporary physics. However, it is not clear that this focus on energy (as such or as energy-in-transformation) avoids the critical remarks Deleuze makes at the start of the final chapter of Difference and Repetition.

The penultimate chapter argues against a peculiar straw man -- an image of a Deleuze who gradually dispensed with reflections on politics after the books with Guattari in the 1970s. Crockett claims that Badiou is one of the "perpetrators" of this "conventional account of Deleuze's philosophical trajectory," (173) though it seems to me that Crockett himself is more guilty of this charge, suggesting as he does that "Deleuze tinkered in old age with the age-old question of What is Philosophy?, and since Félix was depressed, he decided as an act of generosity to add Guattari's name to his final book" (173). Never mind, of course, that the central chapter of this hoary hobby volume includes a central chapter on the socio-political origin and context of philosophy. Crockett's "counterreading" (173), which follows Paola Marrati's excellent Gilles Deleuze, advances the claim that Deleuze's work on cinema constitutes his central contribution to political thought. While this is certainly hyperbolic, it is nonetheless a welcome claim.

The last entry turns somewhat strangely to the topic of the political situation in Haiti. Now, Crockett notes (208n1) that he has no particular expertise on this topic, but nonetheless proceeds to elaborate a theory of the Haitian situation by way of popular histories, Marxist economics, Derrida and (only marginally) Deleuze among others. This theoretical bricolage culminates in the bizarre claim that the Lacanian concept of the empty signifier deployed by Ernesto Laclau "indicates that the people are missing, in Deleuze's terms." (191) This seems an unfortunate construction not only due to Deleuze's antipathy towards linguistic categories post Logic of Sense, but because it is at once too abstract and not abstract enough (to use a quite brilliant critical formulation from A Thousand Plateaus) -- it is too theoretical in a generalised abstract manner, while not attaining to concepts that respond to the Haitian situation as such. This specificity of situations is, let's recall, a point that both Badiou and the crepuscular Deleuze and Guattari of What is Philosophy? insist on inflexibly.

While these quite various contributions do engage with Deleuze's work in some way, it is not clear what it all amounts to, nor how it particularly rests upon the earlier presentations of Deleuze's philosophy, let alone the summaries of Badiou's key works. They are perhaps best read independently, as attempts to engage with particular problematics, rather than as the conclusions of a thoroughly elaborated comparative argument, since, even if such an argument had been advanced by Crockett, it would be difficult to see how it could add anything to such disparate deliberations.

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I began by describing Crockett's book as enthusiastic. It should be clear by now that this is not meant in a positive manner. Surveying the field of Deleuze studies, one cannot help be struck by the miasmatic ubiquity of this kind of non-specific effusiveness. The field, as a result, has produced a lot of unhelpful work. It seems to me, conversely, that one of Badiou's most important contributions to contemporary thought has been to inject into it a liberating emphasis on rigour and method, cold and impassive in character. Enthusiasm is no help for scholarship, or for the comprehension of difficult thinkers. If what we want from at least some books of philosophy is this kind of precision and fidelity, we could use a great deal more coldness and cruelty than Crockett is willing to give to his readers.


[1] This really is a generalised tendency in Crockett's book, and one could quote at substantial length. Consider only the following examples, selected more or less at random: "In some respects, Difference and Repetition can be read as more ontological, whereas The Logic of Sense is more epistemological" (57); "As I discussed in chapter 2, Being/virtual vs. being/actual is too oppositional" (76); "There is something excessive and inexistent about the superiority of parts over sets themselves" (129); "Deleuze delves deeply into thought in an attempt to create a new brain for our species, which is an explosive political activity." (182)