Deleuze/Guattari & Ecology

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Bernd Herzogenrath (ed.), Deleuze/Guattari & Ecology, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 209pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780230527447.

Reviewed by Eugene Holland, The Ohio State University



Taken together with Issue Number 15 (Summer 2007) of the online journal Rhizomes, Bernd Herzogenrath’s collection provides a fairly comprehensive mapping of the relations between Deleuze and Guattari’s philosophy and what we might call “ecologism”. If one were to accept Arne Naess’s distinctions among ecology, ecophilosophy, and ecosophy (invoked by Bogue, p.43), it would have been better to title the volume “Deleuze/Guattari and Ecophilosophy” inasmuch as Deleuze and Guattari are doing philosophy, not science (to which Naess limits his notion of ecology). Ecophilosophy treats the relations between ecological problems and philosophical ones — certainly a central concern of Deleuze/Guattari. Nevertheless, Guattari himself used ecology in a much broader sense, recognizing the importance of scientific contributions to ecophilosophy, but ultimately stressing the values embodied in humans’ relations to the natural environment, which Naess characterizes as “ecosophy”. Hence the book’s title seems perfectly appropriate. Like most anthologies, this one suffers from some unevenness of quality among the essays, and from something like a lack of focus — although the field of Deleuze/Guattari-inspired ecological studies may be young enough to explain and excuse this. A slightly different order to the essays, however, could have brought several common themes or emphases into sharper focus.

There is much to be said, for example, in favor of starting the collection (as Herzogenrath has done) with Manuel DeLanda’s essay on “Ecology and Realist Ontology”. Developments in contemporary science (and mathematics) , after all, were crucial to Deleuze and Guattari, who were in an important sense realists, and few authors are better placed than DeLanda to explicate recent developments in complexity theory and non-linear mathematics and to construct a realist ontology from these developments. Yet there are some serious disadvantages to opening with this essay. For one thing, while he presents a version of realist ontology largely “inspired” by Deleuze, DeLanda forthrightly admits that he “breaks with his [Deleuze’s] position at many points” (p.25). Since the point of the essay — usefully — is to present a coherent version of realist ontology rather than to specify points of agreement and disagreement with Deleuze, readers unfamiliar with the work of Deleuze and Guattari have no way of knowing where DeLanda’s perspective departs from their own. One thing becomes clear from the very start, though: philosophy for DeLanda is the handmaiden of science — something that cannot be said for Deleuze and Guattari themselves, who distinguish clearly between the two, and give philosophy pride of place. For DeLanda, philosophy serves to clarify — for scientists and non-scientists alike — the ontological basis on which science proceeds; unlike Deleuze and Guattari, DeLanda doesn’t seem to credit philosophy with having or pursuing problems or tasks of its own. For DeLanda, the question is: What must the mode of being of reality be, for contemporary science to be true?

One of the great virtues of Deleuze and Guattari’s and DeLanda’s perspective is to have presupposed and formulated, respectively, a realist ontology that “does not depend on essences”, but on processes instead (p.24). Navigating expertly among a variety of untenable views, including nominalism, idealism, social constructivism, essentialism, and positivism, DeLanda shows how the being or

identity of each individual entity … [is] accounted for by … the individuation process that historically generated the entity in question; and [how] any regularities in the processes themselves … [are] accounted for in terms of an immanent (nontranscendent) abstract structure (p.27).

One of the many advantages of this view is its break with “hylomorphism” — the notion that inert matter obeys laws imposed on it from the outside. Entities are understood instead as complex amalgams of both actualized and non-actualized (potential) tendencies which form an open set of capacities to interact with other entities in unforeseen and unforeseeable ways — in the formation and transformation of ecosystems, for example (p.30). The pay-off of this view for ecological thinking (if not for ecophilosophy) is clear, as is the importance of DeLanda’s contribution to the volume as a whole.

This is not to say that, as lucid as it is, the essay has solved all the problems besetting realist ontologies. As DeLanda acknowledges, there is a kind of vicious circle in play here, whereby a realist ontology developed as a foundation for objective knowledge in hard sciences takes as its points of departure bits of knowledge drawn from those very sciences in the first place (p.27). To sidestep the problem, DeLanda invokes a computer science metaphor he calls “bootstrapping”, whereby a minimum of objective knowledge is simply assumed to be true, subject to later correction in light of the fully-developed ontology. Something like Karen Barad’s “inter-agential realism” — itself derived from the hard sciences, but not presuming objective knowledge to begin with — might have served better here, and seems more in line with what Deleuze and Guattari call the “plane of reference” as a crucial component in their philosophy of science (What is Philosophy? 118 and passim). In the final analysis, though, there is a lot more to Deleuze and Guattari’s collaborations than philosophy of science, and this is why the collection would have been better off starting with Ron Bogue’s essay than DeLanda’s, with its nearly-exclusive focus on science.

Bogue starts by comparing Deleuze and Guattari’s implied ecological thinking with the deep ecology of Arne Naess. While they do not do ecology themselves (in his narrow sense of the term), they are certainly ecophilosophical thinkers, and it can be argued (as Bogue does here) that they have an ecosophical orientation valorizing biodiversity. Like DeLanda, Bogue highlights the open-ended nature of both individual entities and the ecosystems they form and inhabit. Inasmuch as interaction with different organisms may actualize different tendencies in a given organism, species diversity multiplies the potential for difference and change, and is therefore valorized. More than DeLanda, however, Bogue emphasizes the distinction Deleuze and Guattari draw between the “relative global” and the “local absolute” as ways of characterizing a closed or open-ended whole. Corresponding to their concept of striated space, the relative global totalizes the whole and demarcates the position and perspective of every entity in relation to the totality. In terms of the local absolute, by contrast, the whole is only ever seen from the various perspectives of diverse entities. Invoking Humberto Maturana and Francisco Varela’s second-order cybernetics, Bogue insists that for Deleuze and Guattari, the whole is not available or representable as such, as if from some outside perspective, but can only be understood from local positions of embodied action. Here, too, something like Barad’s inter-agential realism seems relevant, although Bogue himself likens Deleuze and Guattari’s position to Donna Haraway’s account of cyborgs, instead. In any case, the strong contribution of Deleuze and Guattari’s work to ecological thinking is their thorough deconstruction of any opposition between humans and nature: “nature = industry = history”, they boldly claim in Anti-Oedipus; the whole (the cosmos) is composed entirely of contingent assemblages nested contingently within other, equally-contingent assemblages, of which the human (and other) species’ situation within the biosphere is one among many (Anti-Oedipus 25). One of the ecosophical implications of this view, as Bogue points out, is that — especially given the practically limitless supply of energy streaming at the earth from the sun — there is no such thing as “the balance of nature” that human industry could have upset; or rather, there is only a plethora local balances and imbalances which have to be assessed not from some global perspective, but from myriad local ones — hence Bogue’s reference (in the title of his essay) to “A Thousand Ecologies”.

The other reason for Bogue’s essay to lead the volume is that, alongside science, he pays considerable attention to art, about which DeLanda has practically nothing to say. One of the strongest implications of refusing to separate human being from nature, developed by Deleuze and Guattari in their analysis of musical (and other) refrains, is that “art does not wait for humans to begin”: human artistic production is considered in relation to the music, dance, etc. of other species. Treating both art and science is particularly helpful because most of the other essays in the collection fall fairly neatly into these two categories.

One exception to this categorization is Jonathan Maskit’s essay on the important topic of “Subjectivity, Desire, and the Problem of Consumption”. No serious ecological thinking can neglect the related issues of over-consumption and over-population. Maskit is surely right to argue (against Arne Naess, among many others) that simply knowing we’re consuming too much is not sufficient to change behavior; we have to want to change. It is a question, in other words, of desire and the construction of subjectivity, not merely of objective knowledge. Maskit thus argues convincingly for an environmentalism that is not “an ascetic practice that requires denial but … an opportunity to think who we are as subjects,” albeit drawing rather narrowly on Guattari’s Three Ecologies. We would have gotten a much more complete picture of the dynamics of subjectivity and the production of desire and consumption, however, had he also referred to the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia (mistakenly referred to here as the two volumes of Anti-Oedipus, p.135), and in particular to the first volume.

The other exception to the categorization of essays I have suggested is Verena Andermatt Conley’s piece. Here Conley makes it clear (citing Chaosmosis) that Guattari himself considered the ecosophy developed in his late works to be a “form of schizoanalysis” (p.117) (although she mistakenly identifies the volume in which schizoanalysis was first elaborated by Deleuze and Guattari: it was Anti-Oedipus, not A Thousand Plateaus [p.119]). The relative merit of Guattari’s later work, as Conley explains, is: to have addressed ecology explicitly in his Three Ecologies, against the backdrop of earlier collaborations with Deleuze; to have done so in a way that calls for “transversal” connections to be made among our understandings and practices of environmental ecology, social ecology, and what Gregory Bateson (a significant influence on both Guattari and Deleuze) called “ecology of mind”; and to engage these three ecologies more or less simultaneously. The fact that most of the essays collected here fall under the category of either science or art suggests how difficult such transversal thinking still is.

Along with DeLanda, essays by Hanjo Berressem, John Protevi, and Dorothea Olkowski comprise the science series. Berressem’s essay provides a careful examination and expansion of Maturana and Varela’s notion of “structured couplings” (invoked briefly by Bogue, p.45) as a way of understanding the reciprocal coevolution of organisms and environments. It also supplies a connection (missing in Maskit’s essay) between Guattari’s later, explicitly ecological work and his collaborations with Deleuze by explicating the radical Deleuzian philosophy underlying Guattari’s radical ecologies (pp.57, 61 and passim). Drawing on systems theory, Berressem spells out the “individuation process” identified by DeLanda in terms of “eigenorganizations” — self-organizing entities that are both coupled structurally with their “external” environments and composed “internally” of similarly self-organizing components. The result is an “assemblage theory” of radical ecology that “conceptualizes the world … as a multiplicity of … recursively nested machinic aggregates, all of which are radically immanent to a plane of intensities/energetics” (p.67). In an amazing tour de force, Protevi provides a radically materialist account (perhaps inspired by, and certainly similar to, DeLanda’s One Thousand Years of Non-Linear History) of Hurricane Katrina in terms of what he calls “political physiology” (p.165). Nothing could illustrate better a set of “recursively nested machinic aggregates” that Protevi’s patient and thorough-going exploration and inter-relation of “the land, the air, the sun, the river and the sea; the earth, wind, fire and water; geomorphology, meteorology, biology, economics, politics, [and] history” (p.165). Far better than DeLanda, Protevi is able to demonstrate and explain how "Hurricane Katrina was an elemental and a social event". With Protevi, that is to say, it is clear that Deleuze and Guattari produce and inspire science-informed political philosophy, not politically agnostic philosophy of science (p.165; emphasis added).

The essays comprising the art series are far more wide-ranging and diverse — although they tend to favor Guattari’s work over Deleuze’s and their collaborations. Gary Genosko’s essay on "Subjectivity and Art in Guattari’s The Three Ecologies" leads off the series, drawing on un-published as well as published work to show why Guattari insists on three ecologies rather than one, and why aesthetics and subjectivity are crucial to successful interactions among the three. Genosko asserts that Guattari’s “most original contribution to the theorization of ecology … [is his] concern with the quality of subjectivity [as] what holds together art and ecology” (p.106). Stephen Zepke draws a useful parallel between the turn in Robert Smithson’s artwork toward “an art of direct intervention” in environmental concerns and Deleuze’s similar turn in his collaborations with Guattari to more direct political engagement, starting with Anti-Oedipus. Herzogenrath himself contributes a fascinating examination of the music of Ives, Cage and Adams, read against an illuiminating contrast between Emerson’s hylomorphic idealism and Thoreau’s immanent materialism. If, following Thoreau and Adams, “we listen carefully to noise, the whole world becomes music” (p.228). That is, “®ather than a vehicle for self-expression, music becomes a mode of awareness” of the world as a dynamic, music-producing system (p.228). Mark Halsey, adapting Deleuze’s theories of signs from Difference and Repetition, Proust and Signs, and the cinema study, offers an insightful reading of the novel and film, Deliverance, as a drama of the move from “signs of recognition” to “signs of encounter” provoked by the trio of urbanites’ venture into the lawless wilderness of backwoods Georgia. Alongside Genosko’s more theoretical discussion, these three essays present successful applications of Deleuze and Guattari to a range of aesthetic objects or genres.

Other essays in the anthology are less successful, and some don’t obviously belong in the collection at all. “Ecology” is a notoriously difficult term to circumscribe, but even granted the extraordinary breadth of Deleuze and Guattari’s (solo and collaborative) perspectives, Herzogenrath’s volume makes an important and welcome first stab at outlining the relations between their work and the burgeoning field of ecologism.