Deleuze, Kierkegaard and the Ethics of Selfhood

Deleuze Kierkegaard And The Ethics Of Selfhood

Andrew M. Jampol-Petzinger, Deleuze, Kierkegaard and the Ethics of Selfhood, Edinburgh University Press, 2022, 184pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474476089.

Reviewed by Henry Somers-Hall, Royal Holloway, University of London


While there are references to Kierkegaard scattered through Gilles Louis René Deleuze’s work, these references have largely been overshadowed by the more pronounced (and less overtly ambivalent) influence of Nietzsche on Deleuze’s thought. For both, opposition to Hegel is a central theme in their thought, which for both leads to an attempt as Deleuze writes, ‘to escape the element of reflection’ (Deleuze 1994: 8). Similarly, both emphasise the importance of philosophical style, and move to indirect communication as a way of avoiding what they see as a tendency to conflate the representation of movement or becoming with becoming itself in traditional philosophical discourse. Nonetheless, there is an obvious difference between Deleuze and Kierkegaard, with Deleuze being a thoroughgoing atheist, and Kierkegaard a major theological thinker. In this book, Andrew Jampol-Petzinger focuses on the normative dimensions of both philosophers’ work, arguing that such a reading can diffuse some of the tensions between the theological positions of the two philosophers, as well as providing a corrective to some of the readings of Deleuze’s thought that emphasise the self-destructive aspect of the Deleuzian ethical project. Jampol-Petzinger addresses this through a focus on the account of the self that both philosophers develop, one that rejects a unified model of the self in favour of an account that draws out the consequences of Kant’s fracturing of the self in his paralogisms.

Jampol-Petzinger develops his project over five chapters, the first tracing the development of a shared problematic for Deleuze and Kierkegaard from issues arising from Kant’s paralogisms which are then taken up in the Romantic tradition. The second chapter, perhaps the most important for the argument of the book, argues for a series of parallels between Deleuze’s account of repetition as an account of the constitution of the self in Difference and Repetition and Kierkegaard’s own account of repetition. The third chapter argues that contra the terminological differences between Deleuze’s philosophy of immanence and Kierkegaard’s valorisation of transcendence, we in fact find a number of affinities between the two philosophers, particularly in the rejection of rational morality. The fourth chapter works through some of Deleuze (and Pierre-Félix Guattari)’s explicit references to Kierkegaard in the later work, while the final chapter explores some of the more recent political interpretations of Kierkegaard’s work.

The book uses Deleuze and Kierkegaard to develop the specific project of formulating a new ethics of self-hood. It is not an attempt to provide a complete account of Deleuze’s reading of Kierkegaard (the closest to this currently available is Justo 2012). Jampol-Petzinger also does not address the place of Hegel in the relationship between Deleuze and Kierkegaard at all, and only six pages of the book are devoted to Deleuze’s criticisms of Kierkegaard. This does lead to some problems with the reading of their relationship offered, which I will return to shortly, but Jampol-Petzinger makes a strong case for drawing out the affinities between the ethical projects of Deleuze and Kierkegaard.

Chapter One develops a basis for the reading offered in terms of the Romantic tradition. He very effectively shows the legacy of the fracture of the self we find in Kant’s paralogisms throughout the Romantic tradition, in Friedrich Hölderlin’s work, and through to Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. In doing so, the opening chapter sets the stage well for the argument.

Chapter Two sets out the accounts of repetition found in Deleuze and Kierkegaard and provides a foundation for the later normative analyses. The chapter begins with Jampol-Petzinger’s account of Deleuze’s three syntheses in Difference and Repetition, each involving a different form of repetition, which play an analogous role to the syntheses of Kant’s A deduction in Deleuze’s thought. Jampol-Petzinger reads the first synthesis as showing how a subject is formed through the constitution of relations of past and future between a series of elements in time, presenting clearly Deleuze’s claim that the subject is the result of the ordering of time, rather than its cause, then reading the second synthesis as tied to Plato’s account of reminiscence. Deleuze’s account of the third synthesis is tied to the Eternal Return, and Jampol-Petzinger distinguishes clearly between the ethical reading of it and the more ontological reading offered by Deleuze, drawing on Nietzsche and Philosophy to draw out the claim that it is the closest approximation of becoming to being. Kierkegaard’s three repetitions for Jampol-Petzinger equate to the aesthetic, resignation (a Stoic approximation to repetition), and religious repetition. In each of these cases, he draws a parallel with one of Deleuze’s syntheses, concluding by arguing that the third repetition, faith, for Kierkegaard involves giving the kind of significance that Plato gives to the eternal to time itself, thus paralleling Nietzsche’s result in the doctrine of the eternal return.

There are a number of problems with the equation of these two sets of repetitions that are not addressed. First, while repetition is a human phenomenon for Kierkegaard, Deleuze is a panpsychist, and as such, his own three syntheses apply also to organic and even inorganic matter. ‘Perhaps it is irony to say that everything is contemplation, even rocks and woods, animals and men, even Actaeon and the stag, Narcissus and the flower, even our actions and our needs. But irony in turn is still a contemplation, nothing but a contemplation’ (Deleuze 1994: 75). This broader range is in tension with the ethical orientation of Kierkegaard’s thought. Second, it seems to me that Deleuze’s three accounts of repetition in the three syntheses provide an alternative to Kant’s own account of the three syntheses in the transcendental deduction, showing how a meaningful world and a subject emerge. As such, they occur simultaneously and operate together to give a unified account of synthesis. Different forms of repetition for Kierkegaard seem to present a series of exclusive attitudes (Either/Or!) rather than a unified process of synthesis. It is not clear how strong the analogy here is, then, between the two sets of categories. Finally, while Jampol-Petzinger argues that both Kierkegaard and Deleuze hold that the second repetition is Platonic, I would argue that a closer reading shows that in fact Deleuze raises this claim in order to later reject it: ‘does not Plato already confuse the being of the sensible with a simple sensible being, with a pure qualitative being [aisthēton]?’ (Deleuze 1994: 141). In fact, I think Deleuze and Kierkegaard are actually close here in a sense not recognised by Jampol-Petzinger, since for Deleuze the misreading of the second synthesis as Platonic, and for Kierkegaard the second account of repetition, which he equates with infinite resignation, both involve understanding repetition outside of time. In doing so, both fail to give us an adequate account of repetition. The sections that outline these claims are rather short (four pages on Deleuze’s first two syntheses, for instance), but seem to me to play a pivotal role in Jampol-Petzinger’s argument, since it is on the basis of the affinities between the accounts of repetition that the ethical affinities of the later chapters are grounded. Perhaps my worries here could have been assuaged, but there is no engagement with the growing literature on Deleuze’s account of repetition, and little with the technical details of Deleuze’s metaphysics, which would be needed to answer these challenges.

There is a more serious difficulty with the third synthesis, however, which concerns the nature of the repetition it reveals. While Jampol-Petzinger argues for a similarity between these third modes of repetition, Deleuze argues that there is a sharp divergence between his thought (and Nietzsche’s) and Kierkegaard’s on this point: ‘But this is all the more reason to ask why their coincidence concerning this fundamental objective, the theme of repetition, even though they understand this objective differently?’ (Deleuze 1994: 11). For Deleuze, ultimately, Kierkegaard’s third repetition leaves us as subject in an immediate relation to the absolute, the absolute here being a transcendent God. ‘If God himself had not willed repetition, the world would not have come into existence’ (Kierkegaard 1983b: 133). Here, on Deleuze’s reading, we still find the structures of the subject and object that he sees as so problematic for traditional philosophy. Deleuze’s third synthesis, on the contrary, relates us to a different absolute. In this case, for Deleuze, we find something more like a Spinozist substance, albeit one of becoming rather than being, prior to its individuation into modes. In other words, we could say that while Jampol-Petzinger is right to see the paralogism as a shared moment between Deleuze and Kierkegaard, for Kierkegaard, the active subject prior to the categories is still something analogous to the synthetic transcendental unity of apperception that it was for Kant, whereas for Deleuze, it is time itself which constitutes itself into the subjects that we find around us, which ultimately are only modally distinct from each other. This implies, I think, that at least in the early work, Deleuze’s interest in Kierkegaard is not in his positive results, but in the fact that he tries to return us to thinking about becoming on its own terms, rather than as a representation of becoming, though what this means for each of them is very different.

The final three chapters of Jampol-Petzinger’s book move on to address the ethical and political implications of the affinities between Deleuze and Kierkegaard. While I am sceptical of aspects of Jampol-Petzinger’s reading in the second chapter, the fate of this chapter is ultimately less important than it might be for the book as a whole, since Deleuze changes his views on Kierkegaard as his own thought develops. It should come as no surprise then, that in Chapter Four, where he sets out some of Deleuze’s actual encounters with Kierkegaard, all of these encounters are from Deleuze’s later works (the Cinema books, A Thousand Plateaus, What is Philosophy?). These are all ably handled by Jampol-Petzinger. Returning to Chapter Three, Jampol-Petzinger begins by giving an account of Deleuze’s immanent ethics, drawing on the work of Spinoza. Here he develops Deleuze’s reading of Spinoza as holding that God’s commandment to Adam not to eat the apple was a descriptive rather than prescriptive statement. ‘“God reveals to Adam that the fruit will poison him because it will act on his body by decomposing its relation”, writes Deleuze, “but because Adam has a weak understanding he interprets the effect as a punishment, and the cause as a moral law, that is, a final cause operating through commandment and prohibition”’ (79). Immanent ethics, then, is an ‘ethology’ that deals descriptively with determining those relations that will increase the power of a given entity, and those that will decompose it, as opposed to a morality which functions in terms of normative laws. Jampol-Petzinger argues that just as immanent ethics relies on those individual aspects of the subject that determine which relations with the world will increase or decrease their power, we can note that the relation of faith, ‘where the single individual as single individual is higher than the universal’ (Kierkegaard 1983a: 55) likewise returns us to the singular. (We might, however, wonder here whether the immanent ethics of Spinoza with its discrimination of causes really fits the knight of faith who ‘finds pleasure in everything, takes part in everything, and every time one sees him participating in something particular, he does it with an assiduousness that marks the worldly man who is attached to such things’ (Kierkegaard 1983a: 39)). Jampol-Petzinger argues that this Kierkegaardian moment may allow us to maintain the emphasis on the unique manner of existing of the individual we find in immanent ethics, but without the ‘strain of Nietzschean elitism’ (99), as Tamsin Lorraine puts it, that we also find in Deleuze and Guattari’s work.

Chapter Four develops some extended accounts of Deleuze’s analyses of Kierkegaard. Beginning with the Cinema books, Jampol-Petzinger presents an exceptionally clear analysis of Deleuze’s readings of choice in Kierkegaard’s thought, where choice is understood as not between terms but between modes of existence. In Cinema 2, we find an account of how modern cinema often shows the ‘breakdown of the cinematic sensory motor schema’ (112), taking the subject out of their habitual environment and thus forcing them into a relationship with alterity which mirrors Kierkegaard’s own account of this movement. He shows clearly the parallels between Deleuze and Guattari’s conception of becoming imperceptible and the knight of faith. The chapter concludes with a discussion of the Kierkegaardian concepts of transparency and immediacy, relating these this time to Deleuze and Guattari’s thought. Here, particularly in the discussion of immediacy, some discussion of Hegel would have been relevant, given the importance of mediation to his own thought, and Deleuze’s own tendency to read mediation in terms of Hegel’s thought.

The final chapter broadens the dialectic somewhat to discuss the political implications of the analysis of selfhood and ethics addressed in previous chapters, drawing on recent work by Michael O’Neill Burns and Ada Jaarsma, both of whom develop a political moment not apparent within Kierkegaard’s own thought. Here, we find a focus on a materialist Kierkegaard, and on the importance of belief for political action. These accounts point towards potential future work, but more could be done to evaluate and explore the consistency of these different approaches to Kierkegaard, and to situate them with reference to Jampol-Petzinger’s own projects (and this is equally the case with Christine Battersby’s excellent work, The Phenomenal Woman, which also explores the relation between Deleuze and Guattari and Kierkegaard, and is mentioned in Chapter Three). Do these together form a new coherent project, or more a tendency, and does the author see these projects as an extension of his own work on ethics, or as the groundwork for a future project of his own?

While I have some reservations about aspects of Jampol-Petzinger’s project, these are balanced by the fact that he is breaking new ground in this text in a number of ways. First, this represents one of the few studies of Deleuze and Kierkegaard, and is the first book length study to focus on their work. The analysis provided, particularly in its ethical aspects, is a major achievement in this regard. There are a number of important insights throughout, particularly on the ethics of the Cinema books and Deleuze and Guattari’s later writings, the inverted meanings of immanence and transcendence in Deleuze and Kierkegaard, and on the extent to which Kierkegaard prefigures many of the claims Deleuze will later make around notions such as the immediate. Second, Jampol-Petzinger presents an important corrective to those readings of Deleuze’s ethics that limit Deleuze’s ethical thought to a destruction of all identities. Finally, Jampol-Petzinger has successfully shown the continued relevance of Kierkegaard’s thought to contemporary debates in the continental tradition, and opened the possibility of thinking a Kierkegaardian ethics compatible with a philosophy of immanence such as Deleuze’s.


Deleuze, Gilles (1994) Difference and Repetition (London: Athlone Press)

Justo, José Miranda (2012) ‘Gilles Deleuze: Kierkegaard’s Presence in his Writings’ in Jon Stewart (ed.), Kierkegaard's Influence on Philosophy: Francophone Philosophy, (London: Routledge)

Kierkegaard, Søren (1983a) ‘Fear and Trembling,’ in Fear and Trembling and Repetition, eds. and trans. Howard Hong and Edna Hong (Princeton: Princeton University Press)

Kierkegaard, Søren (1983b) ‘Repetition,’ in Fear and Trembling and Repetition, eds. and trans. Howard Hong and Edna Hong (Princeton: Princeton University Press