Deleuze's Wake: Tributes and Tributaries

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Bogue, Ronald, Deleuze's Wake: Tributes and Tributaries, SUNY Press, 2004, 190pp, $20.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791460185.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


I remember Ronald Bogue’s first book, Deleuze and Guattari, published in 1989. For those of us who study Deleuze’s work, it was an intellectual event: the first book on Deleuze in English. That book is a clear, concise overview of Deleuze and Guattari’s work, and its appearance seemed somehow an important step in conferring intellectual legitimacy on the study of Deleuze. More recently, Bogue has completed a magisterial three-volume study dedicated to Deleuze’s treatment of film, literature, and music and the arts.

This book, Deleuze’s Wake, is of a different character from either the early overview or the more recent detailed studies. As the title indicates, it was put together as a tribute of sorts to Deleuze. The book comprises eight articles, seven of them previously published, concerning Deleuze’s work. The first three fall under the subtitle of tributes, while the others are the aptly named tributaries. These latter are applications of Deleuze’s philosophical framework to a variety of cultural issues. If we may parse the book title’s pun this way, the first part is a wake in the sense of a remembrance (even though two of the three articles in this section were written before Deleuze’s death), while the second part consists of writings in the wake created by Deleuze’s thought.

The tributes are of three different types, but all of them offer frameworks for thinking about Deleuze’s philosophy as a whole. The first, “Deleuze’s Style,” takes Deleuze’s claim that Spinoza has three lines running through the Ethics—an aqueous line of definitions and deductions, a volcanic line of fire in the scholia, and an aerial line in the final sections—and applies them to Deleuze’s own work. Deleuze, too, has a systematic line of terms, definitions, and relations; a volcanic line of rhetoric; and an ethereal line of abstract flights that appear periodically throughout his work. The first lies in the disciplined framework of his concepts. The second emerges periodically when he steps away from that framework to offer flashes of singular insight or critique. (My own favorite flash is in Dialogues, where Deleuze notes that the study of the history of philosophy acts as a police mechanism to silence people who haven’t read X’s book on Y’s treatment of Z’s philosophy.) The third line often appears, with Deleuze as with Spinoza, near the end of his texts. It involves conceptual flights that are difficult to follow but seem often to gesture at a space of creativity or freedom that lies just beyond our reach.

Bogue’s second essay asks the question of whether Deleuze can be characterized as a postmodern philosopher. He answers that question mostly in the positive, noting that Deleuze, particularly in his later work with Guattari, resists the temptation to offer grand narratives and instead writes in more specific areas, jettisoning earlier discussions of Being as difference for multiple and intersecting discussions that resist packaging into a coherent whole. One thinks here particularly of A Thousand Plateaus. Bogue’s claim is suggestive, although I don’t know how compelling. The concept of the postmodern is elusive, if indeed it is coherent, and Deleuze’s reluctance to appeal to the term (a reluctance Bogue notes) is a lead that perhaps should be followed. Not that there is nothing that might be characterized as postmodern in Deleuze’s work. But rather, the term itself does not bring us closer to understanding Deleuze’s writings.

The third essay delves into Deleuze’s interpretation of Foucault’s view of the subject in his book Foucault. Bogue argues that Deleuze is right to see in the Foucaultian subject a play of forces, and that the project of what Deleuze calls Thought, which is a more liberating intellectual activity in contrast to the conformism of knowledge, is itself a play of forces. Here Bogue reads Foucault, alongside Deleuze, through the lens of Nietzsche. For those of us, myself included, who would like to see a little more distance between Foucault and Nietzsche than Deleuze does, this essay stands as a challenge.

These first three essays are not introductions to Deleuze’s thought. They presuppose some familiarity with Deleuzian texts. However, neither are they technical essays; they are more than strict exegetical analyses. Instead, they provide frameworks for thinking about the character and place of Deleuze’s thought. In that sense, they are useful both to those who have read Deleuze and wonder what to make of him as well as to those who have studied Deleuze more intensively and are interested in Bogue’s take on the Deleuzian corpus as a whole.

The second part of the book deals with specific areas in Deleuze’s thought: literature, music, film, television and drama, and religion. I find the article on music, “Becoming Metal, Becoming Death…” the most interesting, for a purely subjective reason: I would not have thought that death metal music could be interpreted in a Deleuzian way. However, Bogue, who seems to have a more than passing knowledge of death metal (who would have thought it?), makes a forceful case for it as, at least in its best moments, a type of Deleuzian becoming. There are several elements Bogue focuses on: death metal’s volume as provoking an intensive experience, the lyrics as rejecting the conformism of more officially recognized types of popular music, the metal as creating a “sonic machine” (p. 91), the extremity of both sound and lyrics, and the music’s speed (which, with Deleuze, he distinguishes from simple rapidity). If death metal can form a type of becoming, however, this raises the question of whether all becomings must, as Deleuze claims, pass through becoming-woman. Death metal, both the music and the audience for it, are overwhelmingly male-oriented. Bogue concludes, contra Deleuze, that there can be becomings that do not pass through becoming-woman.

One wonders, reading this essay, whether death metal can be characterized as a minority in Deleuze’s sense of the term, a warping of the dominant (or majority) genre in order to create something new. Given death metal’s emphasis on machismo, its homophobia and misogyny, one is tempted to say that death metal is not so much a minority form of music as a parody of majoritarian themes. If this is so, then it is unclear whether it can form a Deleuzian becoming, since becomings are all, for Deleuze, becoming-minor. (And, for Deleuze, all becomings-minor must pass through the first minority-becoming: becoming-woman.) Bogue has opened an interesting question, however, one worth pursuing in considering Deleuze’s thought.

Bogue deals directly with the question of minority in the essay preceding “Becoming Metal, Becoming Death…,” entitled “Minor Writing and Minor Literature.” Here Bogue distinguishes Deleuze’s concept of a minor literature from that of many proponents of various identity studies. A minor literature is not, in Deleuze’s view, a literature written from the perspective of an oppressed group; nor is it secondary or neglected literature. Minor literature, of which Kafka would be a primary example, takes the language of the dominant culture and warps it to new purposes, creating what Deleuze calls “lines of flight.” As Bogue notes, for Deleuze this creation involves a certain kind of becoming: becoming-imperceptible. “Becoming-imperceptible is a process of elimination whereby one divests oneself of all coded identity and engages in the abstract lines of a nonorganic life, the immanent, virtual lines of continuous variation that play through discursive regimes of signs and nondiscursive machinic assemblages alike” (p. 73). In short, minor literature creates a type of living that is not merely a replication of dominant motifs but a process of touching on what Deleuze calls “the virtual.”

The two following essays are on cinema and on television and Noh drama. In the first, Bogue unpacks the framework of Deleuze’s concepts in his two-volume study of cinema. He stresses the nonrepresentational character of cinematic signs that Deleuze embraces, and shows the Bergsonian perspective from which Deleuze writes. There are a number of recent studies of Deleuze’s work on the cinema, and this essay is as good a place as any to start coming to terms with that work. The next essay deals with Deleuze’s own essay on Samuel Beckett in Essays Critical and Clinical, showing the relation between Beckett’s television plays and Noh drama.

The volume’s final essay, on religion, concerns the concept of betrayal. It takes the suggestion Deleuze and Guattari make in A Thousand Plateaus, that a postsignifying regime of signs involves a “betrayal of God,” in order to ask the question of what that betrayal might involve. In contrast to more theologically oriented writers, for whom the betrayal might be a matter of taking on the burden of someone else’s betrayal (Bogue here appeals to Jérôme Lindon’s interpretation of the Jonah story), for Deleuze and Guattari this betrayal is a moment of liberation between two dominant signifying regimes. “The passional, postsignifying regime may involve universal betrayal, but the moment of betrayal is itself a break in the regime, an uncoded and unmapped gap that is then recoded and remapped in terms of a specific configuration of power relations” (p. 160).

Deleuze’s Wake is not a single coherent narrative but a mixture of essays that offer a perspective on Deleuze’s work as a whole and others that focus on specific aspects of his work. Those who have read Bogue’s work before and recognize him as one of the U.S.’s foremost interpreters of Deleuze will not be disappointed here. Others, who have read Deleuze and are either wondering what to make of him or are interested in a critical engagement, will also find the book to be engaging. Bogue is, if his writings are any indication, Deleuzian to the core. However, to be Deleuzian is not merely to parrot Deleuze’s words but to seek to use his perspective in order to create perspectives of one’s own. Bogue’s ability to do that is on full display in this book.