Deleuze's Bergsonism

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Craig Lundy, Deleuze's Bergsonism, Edinburgh University Press, 2018, 182pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474414319.

Reviewed by Keith Ansell-Pearson, University of Warwick


A notable feature of Gilles Deleuze's philosophy is the way in which it extensively draws on the ideas of Bergson. Deleuze first began to write on Bergson in the 1950s, a time when Bergson's intellectual ascendancy in Europe and even America had well and truly fallen into decline. Himself unknown in the immediate post-Second World War period, Deleuze was writing innovative essays in the 1950s on a deeply unfashionable philosopher. Even when he did become well known Deleuze's interest in Bergson was treated by many in France and elsewhere with suspicion and even derision. Deleuze always defended his interest in Bergson and was right to do so. Today a major renaissance of interest is taking place in Bergson's texts and ideas and it is baffling that a thinker of such profundity and originality has been absent from the conversations of philosophy for as long as he has.

The renaissance of interest in Bergson taking place today is in no small measure due to the interest shown in Deleuze's philosophy, which relies heavily for its conceptual innovations on Bergson's texts and essays. And yet, Deleuze is a notoriously difficult and dense thinker, and the difficulty and density are in evidence in his text on Bergson published in 1966. In this welcome study Craig Lundy, a scholar who has made notable contributions over the past decade to our appreciation of both Deleuze and Bergson, sets himself the task of explicating and illuminating the character of Deleuze's 'Bergsonism'. He rightly notes that a large number of Deleuze's most significant concepts and themes can be traced back to his engagement with Bergson. These concepts and themes include the virtual and the actual, difference, individuation, problematisation, superior empiricism, and the critique of negation. Overall, Lundy's appreciation vindicates Alain Badiou's claim that of all the thinkers who Deleuze closely studied and wrote on, such as Hume, Spinoza, Nietzsche, and Bergson, it is the latter who was his real master and who emerges as the most profound influence on his thinking.[1]

Lundy's book follows closely the order of Deleuze's own text Bergsonism, and is made up of five chapters covering the following topics and concepts: the method of intuition; duration and multiplicity; memory and the virtual; dualism and monism; the élan vital and differentiation. As he explicates each chapter of Deleuze's text Lundy also draws on Deleuze's essays on Bergson from the 1950s where they prove pertinent, such as his seminal essay 'Bergson's Conception of Difference' first published in 1956 and his lesser known lecture course on chapter three of Creative Evolution from 1959-60. As he notes, whilst Bergsonism is the polished final product of Deleuze's engagement with Bergson, the interpretation was effectively formed in the mid-1950s. This was well before his texts on Nietzsche (1962) and Spinoza (1968), both of which, with respect to key notions and contentions, are Bergsonian-inspired.

In his essays of the 1950s and the text of 1966 Deleuze set out revitalize the appreciation of Bergson. The title of his text of 1966 is symbolic of this effort since it had become commonly accepted by this point in time that, to quote Merleau-Ponty, Bergsonism, when considered as a fashionable philosophy, distorts Bergson since it is little more than a collection of accepted opinions. In large part Deleuze did this by showing how Bergson radicalises Kant's philosophy, providing a superior or transcendental empiricism concerned with the conditions not of possible experience but of real experience, and by contesting the Hegelian dialectic and the primacy accorded to negativity as the motor of change, becoming, and evolution. Already in 1956 Deleuze is proffering the notion of internal difference and centred on an appreciation of Bergson's conception of substance as duration in which a thing differs from itself and immediately. With Bergsonism, then, Deleuze sought, as Lundy succinctly puts it, to 'give new life to the movement of Bergson's thought' (p. 11).

According to Lundy, Deleuze seeks to establish five essential points as a way of highlighting Bergson's importance and originality. First, that intuition is established by Bergson as a rigorous method aiming at precision in philosophy and that it contains 'rules' (in this respect one might compare, as Lundy does not, Bergson to Descartes -- also a great thinker of intuition -- and his 'rules for the direction of the mind'). Second, that Bergson's primary notion of duration is underpinned by a more fundamental theory, which is the theory of multiplicities (this theory is one of the mainstays on Deleuze's philosophizing and extends across the enormous range of his corpus). Third, that the enigmatic notion of the virtual provides the key to unlocking the secrets of Bergson's ontology. Fourth, that Bergson's thinking contains both dualistic and monistic aspects and in ways that are, in fact, complementary. Fifth, that the movement of life involves a movement of differentiation whereby the virtual is actualised in a creative process of divergence.

As well as being a serious and dedicated scholar of Deleuze and Bergson, Lundy shows in this book that he is an assured and able writer. Overall, he succeeds in ably guiding the untutored reader through the intricate details and complex depths of Deleuze's engagement with Bergson and his attachment to 'Bergsonism' as a project of original philosophy. Having said this, though, the reader will need to work hard to make full and clear sense of the character of the conceptual innovations Deleuze derives from his reading of Bergson's texts and essays. Much to his credit Lundy does his best to provide concrete and tangible examples to illustrate the work these concepts can do and as way of getting us to think reality afresh and anew.

I find his coverage of Deleuze's treatment of memory, and the way Deleuze aims to show that for Bergson the past enjoys a genuinely ontological and not merely psychological reality, to be especially helpful. Lundy shows in highly instructive terms how memory, as duration, operates for Bergson and how it is to be conceived in terms of a heterogeneous multiplicity (an interpenetrating progression). He also shows in equally instructive terms how Deleuze first develops his commitment to a notion of the virtual from his deep engagement with Bergson and especially the text, Matter and Memory. Lundy attends incisively to Bergson's remarkable insight that the formation of memory is never posterior to the formation of perception but is rather contemporaneous with it. Bergson's ambition here is an original one since it aims to come up with a genuinely adequate explanation of the nature -- the ontological reality -- of the past.

As Lundy explains, common sense would maintain that memory only comes into being once a perception has vanished. But then, if this is the case, how do we account for the passing of time and credit the past with an ontological reality? In short, we have to think in durational terms in which the past (memory) and present (perception) co-exist and are co-constituted (as virtual and actual). The assumption that memory comes after perception arises from the nature of practical consciousness, namely, the fact that it is only the forward-springing jet of time that interests it. Memory becomes superfluous and without actual interest. It is because the past does not simply follow the present but coexists with it that we can develop an explanation of paramnesia or the illusion of déja-vu, in which there is a recollection of the present contemporaneous with the present itself. The illusion is generated from thinking that we are actually undergoing an experience we have already lived through when in fact what is taking place is the perception of the duplication we do not normally perceive, namely, of time into the two aspects of actual and virtual. In an experience of déja-vu there is a memory of the present in the actual moment itself. I cannot actually predict what is going to happen but I feel as if I can: what I foresee is that I am going to have known it. I experience what Bergson calls a 'recognition to come' in which I gain insight into the formation of a memory of the present.

I have a few criticisms to make of the book. Each of Lundy's chapters contains helpful and succinct demonstrations and, overall, he does a superb job of illuminating the character of Deleuze's engagement with Bergson and showing why without an appreciation of his ideas Deleuze's own philosophy is largely unintelligible. Throughout, the focus is very much on Deleuze's text of 1966 and with providing a careful explication of it. However, I would have preferred in places a more expansive appreciation of philosophy's history so as to better bring out the novel character of Bergson's thinking and Deleuze's appreciation of it. For example, in the important opening chapter, in which Lundy draws attention to the rigorous manner in which Deleuze develops Bergson's attachment to intuition as a distinct method of philosophizing, he acknowledges that owing to the baggage that the term 'intuition' has attracted throughout the history of philosophy it is not an easy undertaking, either for Bergson or for Deleuze, to demonstrate its character. Here the reader would benefit from some discussion of the role intuition has played in the history of early modern and modern philosophy, including its importance for thinkers such as Descartes and Spinoza, the critique of intellectual intuition we find in Kant, how this mode of intuition is taken up as something positive in Schelling, and the important role intuition plays in Husserl's phenomenology, to give a few examples. It's only in the work of certain thinkers that intuition is held in deep suspicion (Nietzsche, for example), and so it is inadequate for Lundy to appeal only to the conceptual baggage the notion has accrued in the history of thought.[2] Lundy could have displayed the full innovative character of Bergson's method of intuition, which is so skillfully brought out by Deleuze, by attending to some of this history. As it is, we have nothing to compare Bergson to and an opportunity to indicate the important role intuition has played in early modern and modern philosophy is missed.

Another criticism I have of Lundy's text concerns the absence in it of any comparative treatment of Deleuze's 'Bergsonism' with other important appreciations of Bergson's philosophy developed in the twentieth century, especially in France, such as the readings developed by Vladimir Jankélévitch, Jean Hyppolite, and Pierre Hadot (Deleuze's text makes very few references to work on Bergson, an exception being an essay by Hyppolite cited in note 10 of chapter three of Bergsonism). Such a treatment might serve to bring out in instructive terms the distinctive character of Deleuze's 'Bergsonism', but also the beginnings of an appreciation of not only what is strong and novel about it but also what it misses about Bergson's philosophy, for example, and as we find in Hadot (if only hinted at),[3] an understanding of Bergsonism as contributing to an appreciation of philosophy as a way of life and in which a chief task is to enhance the power to act and live. Deleuze is so committed to locating a philosophy of novelty and invention in Bergson that he sometimes loses sight of the fact that the key aim of Bergson's thinking -- about duration, for example -- is a practical one, namely, this attempt to show how the powers of acting and living can be enhanced. In this respect Merleau-Ponty was right when he claimed that Bergson is primarily an 'ethical' thinker (perhaps in the same way Spinoza -- who has very different ontology than Bergson -- is a thinker of 'ethics'). Lundy's book ends rather abruptly, without a conclusion. A consideration of Bergson, including Deleuze's 'Bergsonism', in relation to 'practical philosophy' -- which was of concern to Deleuze as evident in his short book on Spinoza[4] -- would have provided him with a fitting denouement.

My final criticism centres on Lundy's appreciation of Bergson's text, Creative Evolution. His reading of Deleuze's chapter on the élan vital and differentiation, the final chapter of Bergsonism, is tremendously clear and helpful, and shows an independent appreciation of Bergson's text. It fails, however, to capture Bergson's important insight into the interconnectedness of life and how, in spite of the fact that evolution is to be characterised in terms of divergent lines (as Deleuze stresses), there continues to exist a sympathetic communication between the different forms and species of life within evolution. Why is this an important insight, one we would be wise to adhere to today? It is because dynamic theories of biology and evolution can only operate through the recognition of the temporal character of living systems and ecological theories can only operate through the recognition of sympathy between organisms. Bergson developed both these approaches at a time when biological science on the whole operated by treating organisms as raw material. Our thinking of life today is moving away from control and towards participation, away from exploitation and towards sustainability. Only now is scientific thought embarking on the path that Bergson pointed out a century ago, a path that he had seen indicated in the evolutionary biology of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century. Whilst this ecological conscience may not have been part of Deleuze's 'Bergsonism', it surely merits being part of a contemporary one.

Having made these criticisms let me close by stating that there is much to admire in Lundy's book; he is helpful on many fronts. Readers will find this book especially instructive for comprehending the nature of Deleuze's commitment to a notion of the virtual. As Lundy astutely points out, the virtual for Deleuze is not merely a philosophical concept or a sort of philosopheme (as Suzanne Guerlac has argued), but rather it is 'the ontology of reality' (p. 128).[5] Lundy readily acknowledges that Deleuze makes much more of the virtual than Bergson ever did, and yet it is a defining feature of his reading of Bergson.

William James was of the view that when you open Bergson you find new horizons looming on every page you read. 'It is', he wrote, 'like the breath of the morning and the song of birds. It tells of reality itself, instead of merely reiterating what dusty-minded professors have written about what other previous professors have thought'.[6] There is, indeed, something utterly fresh and tremendously liberating about the way Bergson pursues the problems of philosophy, and in Deleuze one finds an exacting and rigorous opening up of the immensely fertile possibilities of his ideas. It is to Lundy's great credit that his commentary brings this out with real clarity and precision.

[1] See Alain Badiou, Deleuze. The Clamor of Being, trans. Louise Burchill, University of Minnesota Press, 2000, p. 39.

[2] See Nietzsche, Dawn: Thoughts on the Presumptions of Morality, Stanford University Press, 2011, aphorism 544. When Nietzsche attacks the philosopher's reliance upon intuition, as he does so wittily in this aphorism, it is very much an appeal to 'intellectual intuition' he has in mind.

[3] Pierre Hadot, Philosophy as a Way of Life, trans. Michael Chase, Blackwell, pp. 253-4, p. 258, p. 272, p. 278.

[4] Gilles, Deleuze, Spinoza: Practical Philosophy, trans. Robert Hurley, City Lights Books, 1988.

[5] Suzanne Guerlac, Thinking in Time: An Introduction to Henri Bergson, Cornell University Press, 2006, p. 189.

[6] William James, A Pluralistic Universe, University of Nebraska Press, 1994, p. 265.