Democracy and Disenfranchisement: The Morality of Electoral Exclusions

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Claudio López-Guerra, Democracy and Disenfranchisement: The Morality of Electoral Exclusions, Oxford University Press, 2014, 208pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198705789.

Reviewed by Chad Flanders, Saint Louis University School of Law


What grounds the right to vote? And why has there been so little in the way of direct philosophical inquiry into that right? One answer to the second question could be that it is because we take the right to vote for granted, so that our main concern, historically speaking, has been with making sure the franchise is given to those who are eligible to use it. The United States has in the past denied the franchise to blacks, women, the poor, and the young; and some of its greatest civil rights success stories are about how these groups eventually did get the vote -- how we expanded the circle of citizenship. Those who resisted these advances (and those who work to reverse them now) are cast as history's losers, or as racist, sexist, or worse. The pull of history favors granting universal suffrage: why resist it?

But the fact that the wider culture takes something for granted should not mean it is immune to philosophical investigation; it should even sometimes practically invite such investigation. And some have investigated it, including Jason Brennan's recent, rather skeptical look at the universal franchise in The Ethics of Voting.[1] Claudio López-Guerra's book is less skeptical, but it is also less unified and as a result less persuasive. Brennan wanted to convince us that there was a real problem with voter ignorance and the right to vote and that in some cases (possibly in most cases) people have a duty not to vote. López-Guerra's book is more thoughtful and less aggressively polemical than Brennan's. López-Guerra's more radical idea seems to be suggested as a thought experiment (p. 159, although cf. p. 4), and his other ideas fit comfortably in the mode of arguing for extending the franchise to previously excluded groups -- following the pull of history.

López-Guerra calls the cluster of ideas he defends "the critical suffrage doctrine." The second, and longest, chapter is devoted to a proposal for an "enfranchisement lottery" where a random subset of the population is chosen to actually exercise the vote but is also educated in order to better exercise the right. This imagined system is López-Guerra's way of pumping the intuition that excluding some voters based on their ignorance is not as such objectionable. The remainder of the book works on less hypothetical lines: many children and mentally disabled, deprived of the vote now, should be given it (ch. 3); so too noncitizens who reside in the polity should have the vote, but not citizens who live outside of it (ch. 4); and felons should be enfranchised (ch. 5). A final provocative chapter argues for the normative emptiness of most "democratic theory" (ch. 6).

López-Guerra's book would have been very different, and possibly better, if he had laid out the enfranchisement lottery in chapter one and then devoted the rest of the book to a defense of it. But this is not what he does, and as a result, the first prong of the critical suffrage doctrine (that we can exclude some based on their ignorance) fits less well with the other prongs, which by and large argue for inclusion rather than exclusion. The other ideas, too, work from the default position of universal suffrage in a democracy. The suffrage lottery isn't democracy. So the "critical suffrage doctrine" looks more like a collection of ideas, rather than a set of interrelated theses. It looks like, 'here are some arguments, mostly for extending the franchise, plus a proposal to get rid of universal suffrage and democracy and replace it with a randomly chosen epistemic elite.'

The enfranchisement lottery consists of two steps. First, we have a "sortition" to disenfranchise most of the people who would have the vote under a system of universal suffrage. We randomly pick some voters (or, at this stage, they are "pre-voters") that would be a "microcosm of the electorate under universal suffrage" (p. 29). Those who are not selected can't complain that they were discriminated against -- the process of selection is random, after all -- nor can they complain that the resulting group wouldn't be "demographically identical to the electorate under universal suffrage" (31). That is, the group has a right to be called at least prima facie representative.

That brings us to step two: the "competence-building process" (p. 31). We educate the randomly chosen sample, to make them well-informed. López-Guerra reverts to James Fishkin's idea of having "deliberative polls," or "a mixture of face-to-face discussion, briefing material, and interviews with experts." (p. 36) So we give our randomly chosen group of voters more information -- we don't teach them values, but just give them the facts -- and as a result they are better educated and better able to vote intelligently than the rest of the electorate, who are deprived of the vote. Hence the conclusion, which is the first prong of the critical suffrage doctrine: in some circumstances, excluding some voters on the basis of their ignorance can be justified.[2]

I confess to feeling somewhat tricked by this conclusion. Usually, excluding some people on the basis of their ignorance (or, if not excluding them, encouraging them to not vote) is about setting some standard for what counts as an educated voter and then excluding some on the basis that they don't meet that standard. Here, López-Guerra's enfranchisement lottery uses randomness to exclude -- which doesn't discriminate on the basis of knowledge or anything else -- but then makes some voters smarter. It is a clever way to the exclusionary result, but it raises some questions about implementation. If we started on a completely blank slate, where we were deciding what form of government to have, that would be one thing. It is another and different thing if we are proposing to switch to a randomly chosen epistemic elite when we already have something approaching universal suffrage.

If our baseline is "everybody who is capable votes" -- that is, independent suffrage -- we might worry about switching to a system where some people who are qualified to vote don't get to vote. This switch might generate two types of injustice. First, it might mean that some who are as educated as the epistemic elite don't get to vote, so they might say, "Why, if I have the relevant qualifications already, do I not get to vote?" López-Guerra calls this a commodity-independent injustice: it's not about whether the right to vote is a good thing or not, but about whether it is fairly distributed (p. 21).

But it would seem that getting rid of universal suffrage would deprive a lot of people of the good of the right to vote -- so would entail what López-Guerra calls a "commodity dependent" injustice, a second and distinct kind of injustice (p. 21). That is, we might worry most of all about the enfranchisement lottery's deprivation of the right to vote to the people not chosen in the lottery even if the resulting distribution was fair, or fair enough. If the right to vote is indeed a good thing not just instrumentally but intrinsically, then depriving a lot people of that right is by itself a real failure. It's hard to lose a good thing we've got.

López-Guerra gives two responses to this worry (pp. 55-56). The first is that voting is not the only way we can realize the value of political participation, of which voting is only one form: we can write articles for the newspaper, or we can lobby for our favored candidate or run for office ourselves (see also p. 162). (Of course, a lot of people might not be very good at doing these things or have that much influence if they are.) His second response is that depriving most people of the right to vote is, after all, in service of a good thing: better electoral decisions. But these responses, and the second one, especially, seem to beg the question at issue. What is better, overall? In other places, López-Guerra shows some skepticism about ranking electoral outcomes (pp. 65-67), and more importantly, we might think that part of what makes a good electoral decision is not only the outcome but the process -- a process which could include more or less people. We might think a decision in which a lot of people had voted was a "better decision" precisely because it was more democratic. The lottery seems to replace the value of democracy with the more competent electoral decision-making.

Moreover, López-Guerra's arguments in his first chapter seem discordant with the rest of the book, where he "assume[s] universal suffrage as the institutional background" (p. 5) and argues,inter alia, that children, the mentally ill, and prisoners should be given the right to vote. The discussion of these subjects is well done (although one might have wished for a longer discussion as to what is necessary to be "competent" to exercise the franchise: what does it mean, for instance, to be able to understand the "significance" of the act of voting? [p. 72]). These chapters, however, can be read with profit in isolation from the first chapter, and the chapter on felon disenfranchisement I recommend as especially cogent and thorough. But if we read these middle chapters together with the first chapter, López-Guerra's argument becomes only that the group of potential voters should be expanded, not because they have a fundamental right to vote, but because it would be unfair otherwise. If we are going to have the vote -- the message seems to be -- then it would be unfair to exclude these groups in the way we do.

What then of the so-called "basic" moral right to vote? López-Guerra says more than once that we don't really have one (p. 15, 133). He is certainly correct that a better job of defending that right's sometimes elusive value needs to be made.[3] But again, I return to the problem of where we start from, our baseline. Any proposal for restricting the franchise, even randomly, would be dead-on-arrival not only in America but I also suspect for the rest of the world, and not necessarily because we think restrictions would be made "for no good reason" (although we would worry about that, too[4]). Rather, it seems we really do cling to the right to vote for everyone who is capable, which is not to be replaced with other means of political participation and not to be traded for the promise of better electoral results. This seems like a hard intuition to dislodge -- and most of López-Guerra's book works for rather than against it. But it is to López-Guerra's credit that parts of his tightly argued book (a welcome addition to the regrettably slim library on the subject) may move us to cling to this notion a little less firmly.


Thanks to Michael Neblo for comments.

[2] But then why not educate everyone? López-Guerra's answer is that it would be extremely expensive and be less efficient (pp. 45-46, 59).

[3] Of course, it may be that explicating the value of most or all intrinsic rights will be elusive, for the value of them cannot be explained in terms of anything more basic. For my attempt at an explication, see Flanders, What is the Value of Participation?, 66 Okla. L. Rev. 53 (2013) and also the response by Joshua A. Douglas, The Foundational Importance of Voting: A Response to Professor Flanders, 65 Okla. l. rev. 81, 99 (2013).

[4] Indeed, López-Guerra is at his most persuasive when he recasts most historical claims of the right to vote as merely claims against unfair exclusion (e.g., p. 124).