Democracy in What State?

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Giorgio Agamben, Alain Badiou, Daniel Bensaïd, Wendy Brown, Jean-Luc Nancy, Jacques Rancière, Kristin Ross and Slavoj Žižek, Democracy in What State?, William McCuaig (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2011, 130pp., $22.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231152983.

Reviewed by Ayelet Banai, Goethe University Frankfurt


The collection of essays Democracy in What State? encompasses eight answers by leading radical and critical voices to the question of what democracy means today -- when everyone seems to be in favor of it -- if it means anything at all? Ever since Karl Marx denounced the revolutionary constitutions of France after 1789 for proclaiming false emancipation, radical thinkers in Europe repeatedly have found themselves in a conceptual predicament. Their finest and most promising ideas -- liberty, equality, republic, constitution, democracy and the common good -- became tainted with Conservative mischief. To make things worse, during the Cold War conservative-Liberals across Western Europe and in the United States were on the intellectual offensive, actively appropriating all of these ideas to themselves -- as if that political-economic order, which no doubt had to be defended against the Soviet Union -- was delivering on the promise of the eighteenth- and nineteenth-century emancipation-seeking radicalism.

In the engaging contributions in this volume, prominent radicals in social and political philosophy of the present, including Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek, wearily reiterate the acts of this predicament (indirectly pointing towards ways out and ahead), while the essays by Kristin Ross and Daniel Bensaïd stand out in their perceptive capacity to explicate the very problem of thinking about the radical and emancipatory currency of democracy today. "What separates our own time from the extraordinary moment of Rimbaud", Ross points out in her captivating essay about the poet's prophetic illuminations of the intimate relationship among an appeal to false democracy, rampant commercialization, and colonial subjugations, "is something called the cold war and its ending" -- a period when the word democracy came under full control of governments in the Western world "leaving nary a trace of its former emancipatory resonance" (p. 97). Bensaïd, a dedicated political leader and intellectual of the Trotskyite Left in France until his death last year, pointedly concludes:

contrary to what is widely believed, Marx was not voicing contempt for democratic freedoms when he characterized them as "formal"… The task of revolutionizing democracy, which became practical with the revolution of 1848, remains to be accomplished, if criticism of parliamentary democracy as it really exists is not to slide towards authoritarian solutions and mythic communities (pp. 42-3).

Readers of this collection would be compelled to conclude, possibly in disagreement with the authors' own judgment, that the challenge to democrats, who take democracy to be either a form or project of human freedom in social relations, does not lie in improving the overarching theories of democracy and of its official political rules, but in making actually and practically something better out of the existing formal conditions and material wealth in Western democracies. Disappointing as this conclusion may seem at first to social and political philosophers keen to employ their scholarly skill and effort in the service of democratic transformation, the collection is an exquisite and indispensible read. It lucidly brings home the point that emancipatory potentials are unlikely to be unearthed through devising ever more elaborate theories of what democracy is and should be. These potentials are far more likely to be discovered in persistent action, which would demand that we make the formal conditions of democracy face their own self-justificatory promise and do our best to make them live up to it. In this way, the philosopher's quest is reinvented and redirected.

Giorgio Agamben's brief introductory note is concerned with the ambiguous unity that modern western-European languages and philosophy inherited from the Greek, between constitution and government; between two distinct rationalities -- the legislative power of the body of citizens and the executive power of government. "What if it were just a fiction" he asks, "a screen set up to hide the fact that there is a void at the center, that no articulation is possible between these two elements, these two rationalities?" (p. 4) Yet this undoubtedly fundamental question has been examined in theory and addressed in principle by an impressive variety of philosophers and sociologists, ranging from conservative-liberals like Benjamin Constant to anarcho-syndicalists like Rudolph Rocker, via social-democrats like Franz Neumann, and from champions of private freedom like de Tocqueville to neo-republicans like Arendt. Wouldn't we, then, be better advised to try to carry into our social realities the results that a vast variety of theories of democratic power already offer, instead of asking time and again the same questions in theory, yielding evermore intricate theoretical constructs that overwhelm action?

What features as an open question for Agamben emerges from the subsequent contribution by Badiou as a foregone conclusion: a democratic government is an impossibility. Democracies today engage in a collective death-wish "for the democratic nonworld is a leakage in time. Consumption is consuming it" (p. 14). Badiou resuscitates elements of Plato's critique of democracy as creating a world that is not really a world and an exclusively pleasure-seeking subject, which accounts for "the profound stupidity of contemporary democratic societies" (p. 12). He argues that democracy, in the literal sense of the word "the power of peoples over their own existence" can only be achieved in the withering away of the State and in communism, posited as the opposite of capitalist parliamentarism; for "it is communism, which, as Hegel said at the time, absorbs and surmounts the formalism of the age of restricted democracy" (p. 15). While there is probably not much wrong with waiting for a salvation, it is important to take the essay for what it is: a yearning for the miraculous to erupt within history and redeem the philosopher and some mythical community from the toil of transforming a really existing society into a freer one. Whereas Plato and Hegel had divinity and a philosophy of history respectively on their side, Badiou's 'democracy' has no substitute grounds (short of the miraculous) to stand on.

In contrast, Bensaïd's inspired review of the achievement and limit of democratic theory is rich with insights on democracy's political action. It underlines meticulously the main challenges to bringing some of the great radical ideas about democracy into social reality. Bensaïd calls to mind the revolutionary wisdom, following Saint Just and Che Guevara, that "the 'force of heroism' and virtue of example were not enough to bridge the tragic gap between the constituent power and instituted democracy" (p. 31). No revolutionary, he reminds us, has resolved "this mysterious democratic equation, the puzzle which they have handed on to us" (p. 32). This essay reveals a key to the collection's vital illumination of the meaning of thinking about democracy today: it is not in the escape from contradictions into a better world of refined theory, but in the "impurities, uncertainties and wobbly conventions" of "profane politics" (p. 42) that democratic aspirations become meaningful. The purpose of democratic thought today is less in resolving long-standing theoretical contradictions in the idea of democracy (in particular the tragic gap between constituent power and institutions, constitution and government), and more in working within the contradictions -- within the tragic gap -- to find out what can be achieved within it.

The subsequent contribution by Wendy Brown brings forth some of the central conceptual contradictions and structures of power within which democratic aspirations must within. Brown discerningly describes the "frontal assault" that neoliberalism

as a political rationality has launched … on the fundaments of liberal democracy, displacing its basic principles of constitutionalism, legal equality, political and civil liberty, political autonomy, and universal inclusion with market criteria of cost/benefit ratios, efficiency, profitability, and efficacy.

If states, rightly or not, used to justify themselves as the "embodiment of popular rule", they now figure as "operations of business management" (p. 47). Under current circumstances, which coalesce and threaten to devastate democratic freedoms that once were without reach, the question of peoples' will to freedom becomes acute: societies that have enjoyed such freedoms do not seem to resist when they are taken away. Thus, Brown remarks somewhat pessimistically that "it is hard to imagine what could compel humans to the task of ruling themselves or successfully contesting the powers by which they are dominated" (p. 56). While it is hard to say for sure that democracy is still a possibility, she concludes, struggles for it need to "reckon directly" with "the powers destroying the conditions for democracy" (pp. 56-7).

Jean-Luc Nancy in the chapter that follows immerses himself in the refinement of theory: as democracy has come to mean everything and nothing, "the task of thought is to stop letting common sense pullulate with free-floating incoherencies the way it does now and force democratic nonsignificance to stand trial in the court of reason" (p. 59). The chapter is rich with insightful considerations about the non-foundation of democracy, its incapability of "being grounded in a transcendent principle" (p. 66), and its genuine purpose in forming "plateaus of transient equilibrium" among ends conceived and attained elsewhere (p. 73). Yet, it is the very perceptiveness of these considerations that highlights the limits of theorizing democracy today. The non-metaphysical turn has been at the core of liberal and republican democratic political theory for decades, most famously (though in different ways) in the work of John Rawls and Jürgen Habermas. It is the task of thought then to understand why such ideas, initially radical, have come to be associated with mainstream politics, and whether and how it is possible to bring what is already known into what is being lived.

In the brief and vivid interview with Jacques Rancière that comes next, a similar move transpires. Equipped as always with splendid ideas about how to conceive of democracy, Rancière reminds us of the critical function of democracy -- being "the wrench of equality jammed (objectively and subjectively) into the gears of domination, it's what keeps politics from simply turning into law enforcement" (p. 79) -- and warns that it is a mistake to believe that everyone supports democracy today, even in the "so-called ordinary sense of the word" (p. 76). Here too, from the theoretical idea comes a message of action, in order to carry on "the ongoing effort to create forms of the common different from the ones on offer" (p. 80).

The two final chapters of the book, by Ross and Žižek, resume through different and illuminating means lines of thought found in the chapters by Bensaïd and Badiou. Ross revisits Arthur Rimbaud and the brutal suppression in 1871 of the Paris Commune as anticipating the repressive elements of Western democracies today: the elites' hostility to popular mobilization within, and the triumph of markets and commercialization within and without. She concludes that rather than a critique of the insufficiency of democracy in practice, a whole reinvention of democracy is necessary (p. 99). The laudable historical perspective of the essay, in respect to the transformations of the idea of democracy in the past two centuries, raises the question, why believe that a reinvention of democracy in theory, rather than in practice, is needed. Be that as it may, this historical perspective is valuable for both theoretical and applied purposes.

Žižek embarks upon the project of (re)appropriating democracy from liberal to far-left traditions of non-Soviet communism. He takes the revolution in Haiti and present-day situation there as focal points for investigating what radical democratic politics means today, bringing into view a really existing left. The (re)-appropriation of radical democracy, however, may well be more complicated than meets the eye, if Žižek is right to argue that "leftist political movements are like 'banks of rage': they collect rage investment from people and promise them large-scale revenge, the reestablishment of global justice" (p. 111). Moreover, he notes the suspicion in the Western left towards the liberal lines taken by protestors in Iran, who are seen as not sufficiently "anti-Imperialist" and anti-American (p. 120). Since the appearance of the book, uprisings and revolutions have spread across the Middle East and North Africa (including Syria and Libya, two of the places held dear by "anti-imperialists"). A move away from this mindset in the radical left -- which has outlived its cold-war origins for too long already -- is probably the single most important challenge on the way to appropriation of democratic radicalism.

Democracy in What State? displays the richness of radical thinking about democracy today, and is therefore a valuable source for anyone interested in democracy, theoretical radicalism, and their limits in respect to political change. The book's title implicitly draws attention to where this limit is situated. Theorizing about democracy within a State may have exhausted itself, opening up two possibilities: making democracy within a State happen; or thinking, if at all desirable and possible, about democracy beyond it.