Democracy, Justice, and Equality in Ancient Greece: Historical and Philosophical Perspectives

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Georgios Anagnostopoulos and Gerasimos Santas (eds.), Democracy, Justice, and Equality in Ancient Greece: Historical and Philosophical Perspectives, Springer, 2019, 316pp., $139.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319963129.

Reviewed by David J. Riesbeck, Tempe Preparatory Academy


The ideas of democracy, justice, and equality were central to political thought in ancient Greece and remain so for us today. Yet the vast cultural differences between antiquity and modernity inevitably put some distance between ancient concerns and our own. Nonetheless, historical and cultural perspective plays an indispensable role in self-understanding, and this volume seeks to offer just such perspective. Ten of its thirteen chapters focus on Plato, Aristotle, or both. The emphasis therefore falls decidedly on the philosophical rather than the historical, though most of the papers give some attention to matters of context. The quality of the contributions varies, but several chapters provide novel insight or especially helpful overviews of their topics. Much of the volume will be of interest only to specialists in ancient Greek philosophy or politics, but a few of the chapters would reward a wider readership among philosophers and students thinking about justice, equality, and democracy more broadly.

Following the editorial introduction, the volume opens with two historical chapters setting out the economic, social, and political background against which Plato and Aristotle did their thinking. Josiah Ober's 'Institutions, Growth, and Inequality in Ancient Greece' summarizes evidence and arguments from his recent The Rise and Fall of Classical Greece: by pre-modern standards, the classical Greek world sustained exceptionally high economic growth and, in Athens, historically low levels of income inequality, both driven primarily by "fair rules and fierce competition" (24). Claire Taylor, in 'Economic Inequality, Poverty, and Democracy in Athens,' focuses on the ways that Athens' democracy helped to ameliorate poverty for many despite reproducing it for others. Taylor presents a nuanced treatment of Greek ideas about poverty, and she draws fruitfully on recent social scientific work on the relationship between democracy and wealth. Both of these chapters largely reproduce material already published elsewhere, but they provide important perspectives for understanding and assessing the philosophical views discussed in the remaining chapters.

Those remaining chapters range from broad surveys of their topics to narrower interpretive arguments. Gerasimos Santas' 'Plato on Inequalities, Justice, and Democracy' offers a magisterial overview of equality and inequality in the Republic and the Laws. The chapter is valuable for its synoptic vision, but it also does two other things particularly well: it sets out helpful distinctions between different kinds and sources of (in)equality, and it clarifies the different roles that normative principles and empirical assumptions play in Plato's thinking about them. Santas notes that all of the strategies that Plato discusses for solving "the distribution problem of social justice" (162) -- strict equality, proportional equality, floors and ceilings, limits on the distance between the best and worst off -- find parallels in modern discussion; and though few will want to follow Plato in detail, Santas illustrates that his thinking on these matters is more sophisticated than sometimes supposed. One might wish for more critical engagement with Plato on Santas' part, especially in assessing the shifts from the Republic to the Laws. Nonetheless, the chapter provides an excellent entry point for anyone with interests in these topics.

Georgios Anagnostopoulos' 'Justice, Distribution of Resources, and (In)Equalities in Aristotle's Ideal Constitution' does for Aristotle some of what Santas does for Plato, but with a more critical and constructive philosophical agenda. Anagnostopoulos notes that while Aristotle is deeply concerned with equality and inequality, his discussion of the best constitution in Politics VII-VIII apparently does not apply his principle of distributive justice (articulated in NE V.3, elaborated in Pol. III.9-13) to the distribution of wealth and other resources. That principle applies to the distribution of political offices according to merit, but the distribution of other resources is guided by "concerns unrelated to justice" (213), such as minimizing or eliminating factional conflict and meeting citizens' needs. Anagnostopoulos finds this feature of Aristotle's argument puzzling, and he responds by attempting to construct arguments to show that Aristotle could justify many of the same conclusions by appeal to his principle of distributive justice. He goes on to argue that the principle should or at least might have led Aristotle to different conclusions with regard to women, laborers, merchants, resident aliens, and slaves.

The constructive aspect of Anagnostopoulos' approach fails to convince, especially since it requires an interpretation of 'merit' on which a citizen's needs count as a relevant merit. This interpretation seems inconsistent with Aristotle's conception of merit, on which the merit relevant to distributive justice is one's contribution to a shared goal (Pol. III.12 12823a1-3). Anagnostopoulos explores the possibility of treating some needs (those of health or education, for instance) as relevant to citizens' contributing to civic functions, but this maneuver seems not to treat needs themselves as a basis for distribution; it meets citizens' needs not because they are the needs of citizens, but because the citizens will be more effective at their jobs if their needs are met. This approach thereby threatens to reduce the city's concern for its citizens to a concern for their effectiveness as political instruments. Yet, as Anagnostopoulos recognizes, Aristotle justifies many of the arrangements of his ideal constitution by appealing directly to the needs of the citizens.

We find a more fruitful approach to this problem in Paula Gottlieb's 'Aristotle on Inequality of Wealth.' Gottlieb focuses not on the best constitution of Politics VII-VIII, but the second-best constitution of IV.11. She argues persuasively that Aristotle attempts to improve on Phaleas of Chalcedon's proposals for equality in land (criticized in Pol. II.7) and to avoid the sort of 'hour-glass' distribution of wealth common in modern nations. More broadly, however, Gottlieb maintains that Aristotle's reflections on equality and inequality in wealth and other resources are guided not by principles of distributive justice, but by concerns about factional conflict and stability, on the one hand, and the promotion of virtue on the other:

In his discussion of the middling constitution, Aristotle does not address the issue of who deserves wealth. He is describing a system in which most people can enjoy a measured amount of resources. The point of the system is to free everyone of the vices, especially the vice of greed (pleonexia), a vice opposed to the virtue of justice. (266-7)

We can take Gottlieb's analysis further in identifying the fundamental problem with Anagnostopoulos' approach. For Anagnostopoulos, considerations that are not considerations of distributive justice are not considerations of justice at all. Yet the considerations that Gottlieb emphasizes, and that Anagnostopoulos recognizes, are considerations of justice; they belong to what Aristotle calls justice as lawfulness, what commentators often call 'universal' or 'general' justice. Justice as lawfulness is not primarily a matter of obedience to positive law, but of aiming at the common good and acting to "produce and protect happiness and its parts for the political community" (EN 5.1 1129b17-19). Scholars all too often ignore justice as lawfulness, as though it were of minimal interest to Aristotle in comparison to his 'particular' species of justice. In fact, one of the most surprising and disappointing features of this volume is its virtually complete neglect of Aristotelian justice as lawfulness and the common good. Gottlieb does not explicitly connect her treatment of inequality to justice as lawfulness, but she points in the right direction: the purpose of an Aristotelian polis is the happiness of its citizens, and it is that purpose, not considerations of merit as such, that drives Aristotle's thinking about how a city should assign and manage resources such as wealth, education, occupations, and the like.

Of course, Aristotle infamously limits the scope of the happiness and virtue at which his ideal constitutions aim, endorsing slavery, excluding or marginalizing manual laborers and merchants, neglecting resident aliens, and denying citizenship to women. Anagnostopoulos devotes a great deal of attention to these exclusions in Aristotle, and Santas considers similar questions about Plato. Dorothea Frede's 'Equal but Not Equal: Plato and Aristotle on Women as Citizens' considers what the two philosophers thought about women's citizenship and why. Readers familiar with these issues will find few surprises here: the limits and motivations of Plato's apparent egalitarianism in the Republic will fail to satisfy feminist concerns, the Laws extends more rights and opportunities to women than contemporary Greek cities but hardly advocates for equality, and the Timaeus represents a "fall from grace" in its treatment of women as naturally inferior to men; Aristotle's uncompromising exclusion of women derives not from personal misogyny but from his commitment to a sort of naturalistic conservatism that too readily identifies what is usually the case with what is natural and appropriate. Scholars who have argued for alternative interpretations will not find strong reasons to revise their views. In particular, Frede does not fully engage with arguments against her controversial claims that the egalitarianism of the Republic does not extend to the productive class and that Aristotle's understanding of women's psychology does not regard them as constitutionally akratic.

Other chapters likewise focus on specific issues. Christopher J. Rowe's 'Plato on Equality and Democracy' addresses a narrower set of questions than its title suggests, attending especially to whether inequality in wealth per se justifies inequality in power. Rowe defends a negative answer and argues that Plato's criticisms of democracy are more limited than is often supposed. Catherine McKeen and Nicholas D. Smith's 'Like-Mindedness: Plato's Solution to the Problem of Faction' offers a careful interpretation of Platonic homonoia, often translated as 'agreement' or 'consensus' but here taken as a psychological similarity that underlies agreements relevant to resisting faction. The argument, drawing on the role of homonoia in the Alcibiades I to shed light on the Republic, is convincing, but it is unclear whether it points to a solution to the problem of faction significantly different from what others have found in Plato. Deborah K. W. Modrak's 'Virtue, Equality, and Inequality in Aristotle's Politics' explores what roles Aristotle gives to equality in his account of faction and his analysis of constitutions. She discovers a "psychologically perceptive" (256) account of the desire for equality in the explanation of faction and a normative role in guiding attempts to balance competing class interests, but finds the principles involved highly indeterminate.

Terry Penner's 'Inequality, Intention, and Ignorance: Socrates on Punishment and the Human Good' sets out to apply his rich and controversial interpretations of Socratic ethics and psychology to contemporary problems of racial and class-based inequality in education and punishment. In fact the chapter touches on inequality only tangentially, as Penner's central argument advocates the outright abolition of punishment, not its equitable application. Those who have followed Penner's work on Socrates will read this paper with interest, but those more concerned with the philosophy of punishment will likely find its contentions too implausible to take seriously. Penner's case depends on the wildly controversial claims that "none of us ever has the faintest idea of just what it is that we are intentionally doing" (116), that those who harm others harm themselves and thereby fail to achieve their real ends due to ignorance, and that nobody should be punished for any sort of ignorance. Penner offers food for thought about the assumptions behind the practice of punishment, but proponents of standard theories of punishment will not find much of a challenge here.

The two highlights of the volume, to my mind, are David Keyt's 'Aristotle on Freedom and Equality' and Fred D. Miller's 'Aristotle on Democracy and the Marketplace.' Both of these chapters contain some material published elsewhere, but each makes a valuable contribution to understanding Aristotle, and they should prove of broad interest to readers with general interests in these topics.

Keyt considers Aristotle's explicit account of the democratic conception of freedom and equality and reconstructs his implicit account of their aristocratic conception. Drawing on Gerald MacCallum's well known "triadic analysis" of freedom in terms of an agent, an impediment, and a goal, Keyt distinguishes legal freedom ("freedom of a human being from legally imposed servitude"), personal freedom ("freedom of a person to pursue his own goals"), and political freedom, itself divided into civic freedom ("freedom of a citizen from impediments to his personal freedom imposed by the political system under which he lives") and polis freedom ("freedom of a polis from impediments to its autonomy, or self-government, imposed by another polis or nation," 227-8). Aristotle's democratic and aristocratic conceptions of justice involve different conceptions of these freedoms, especially personal freedom, which in turn shape their divergent conceptions of equality. Keyt's reconstruction of the aristocratic conception of freedom is highly plausible, though Aristotle leaves enough implicit to allow for disagreement about details. Where the chapter really shines is in its analysis of the democratic conception.

While some have dismissed Aristotle's treatment of democracy as a polemical distortion, Keyt shows that the democratic conception as Aristotle understands it is coherent and at least somewhat attractive: Aristotle's democrats are "anarchists at heart" (228), but recognize the benefits of living together in a political community, and so value equality in ruling and being ruled as a way of preserving their personal freedom while enjoying the fruits of positive political co-operation. Keyt does not argue that Aristotle accurately represents Athenian democratic ideals, but he successfully shows that the democratic conception Aristotle describes is not a caricature, but at least the outline of a serious alternative to his own aristocratic ideal. That aristocratic ideal also emerges as more coherent and attractive than its critics sometimes allow. In Aristotle's hands it licenses severe inequalities, but ancient democrats accepted many of the same inequalities in their exclusion of women, endorsement of slavery, and privileging of citizens over non-citizens. Though Keyt does not put it in these terms, the fundamental dispute between Aristotle's democrats and aristocrats shares many features of disputes that persist today between proponents of liberal neutrality and political perfectionism. This paper will reward not only Aristotelian scholars, but historians, political theorists, and philosophers sensitive to the history of these concepts and debates.

Miller's chapter begins with Aristotle's critique of extreme forms of democracy on the grounds that they grant citizenship not only to manual laborers, but to merchants and people engaged in other commercial occupations. Aristotle's antipathy toward commercial pursuits is well known but poorly understood. He shares that antipathy, at least broadly, with Plato, and one common view dismisses it as merely an inherited aristocratic prejudice. Miller rightly resists that move; whatever role class bias might have played in Aristotle's views, he defended his judgments on the basis of philosophical arguments that deserve careful analysis and assessment. Those arguments depend in part on the general theses of his ethical theory, but no less importantly on his analysis of commercial practices. After reviewing the basic tenets of Aristotle's 'virtue ethics,' Miller turns to his analyses of barter, commercial exchange and profit-seeking, banking and lending at interest, and commodity speculation. He then develops a thought experiment of the familiar twin-earth sort: we imagine an earth just like ours and a philosopher just like Aristotle except that he has somehow become aware of and accepts the basic principles of modern microeconomics. If this twin-earth Aristotle, 'Aristecon,' reconsiders barter, commerce, banking, and commodity speculation in light of these principles, Miller argues, he will reach markedly different conclusions from Aristotle despite accepting Aristotle's ethical and political principles.

Aristecon's understanding of the mutual gains of trade will enable him to see how each of the parties in exchange can benefit and end up with "the mean relative to him" even though there is no objective equality in the objects exchanged, and even when one or both parties make a profit. So too, his understanding of time preferences will enable him to see lending and borrowing at interest as a potentially fair exchange that assigns to each the mean relative to him, while his appreciation of the roles of risk and knowledge in an economy will allow him to see commodity speculation not as exploitation, but as having a valuable social function. Aristotle also offers a more general critique of commerce as unnatural insofar as it treats wealth as an end in itself or as an unlimited means to the gratification of appetite. Aristecon will instead see that money-making, like medicine, can be and often is subordinated to higher ends that limit the pursuit of wealth maximization. Aristotle's case for excluding people engaged in commercial enterprises from citizenship rests on the view that commercial activities necessarily involve vicious actions or cultivate vicious character. Miller makes a strong case that this view rests in turn on an understanding of commerce inconsistent with modern economics.

Critics with Thomist or Marxist sympathies may doubt that Miller's microeconomic principles suffice to undermine Aristotelian theories of just price or the perversity of profit-seeking exchange. Even those wholly at peace with mainstream economic theories of value and exchange might reasonably doubt that Aristecon is right to dismiss worries about the corrupting effects of profit-seeking. The main value of Miller's chapter, however, is to show that Aristotle's hostility to commerce does not follow straightforwardly from his broader ethical or political theory. By the same token, the modern economic principles that Miller discusses need not conflict with Aristotle's broader ideals, including that of promoting and protecting the common good via the regulation of property and wealth. Anagnostopoulos highlights some of the severe problems that arise from Aristotle's insistence that citizens ideally avoid the tasks of wealth production. Miller's chapter shows that wealth production and commerce need not conflict with the aims of virtue and happiness. Yet one imagines that Aristotle, if not Aristecon, would insist that the city has an important role to play in preventing such conflict from arising. Perhaps contemporary neo-Aristotelians should think the same.

This volume makes a valuable addition to scholarship. It is a pity that only the wealthy will be able to afford it.