Democracy's Reconstruction: Thinking Politically with W.E.B. Du Bois

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Lawrie Balfour, Democracy's Reconstruction: Thinking Politically with W.E.B. Du Bois, Oxford University Press, 2011, 198pp., $39.95 (hbk); ISBN: 9780195377293.

Reviewed by Frank M. Kirkland, Hunter College/CUNY Graduate Center


Lawrie Balfour's Democracy's Reconstruction points out a kind of negligence in political theory. The laxity stems from political theory's longstanding inattention to race and racial injustice as important in a full-fledged and fundamental way to both the character of democratic life and to the inquiry into the ideals and conditions of freedom, equality, and justice that enable that life. If it does attend to them, it treats them as specialties of the aforementioned inquiry or as incidental to the aforementioned life. But it is not simply that race and racial justice have appeared now and then on the democratic landscape, with political theory focusing either on other things or specifically on them as atypical to that life or those ideals. Rather they have mattered and continue mattering to democratic life without political theory seriously attending to them at all. Balfour is of the mind that political theory as a practice remains shadowed by an "unowned past," pertinent not only to the object of political theory's investigation -- democratic life -- but also to the way political theory conducts its investigation on that life.

The aim of Balfour's book is to challenge these states of affairs by endorsing the importance of the corpus of W.E.B. Du Bois. She regards his work as having both longstanding and current significance in its investigation of the democratic experiment, because it strives to understand "the meaning of freedom, equality, leadership, citizenship, and democracy with the slave trade, slavery, and colonial conquest always in sight" (p. 6, emphasis added). Slavery, the slave trade, and colonial conquest are historically not tangentially concurrent with or not simply the underside of democratic life, a life defined and justified by its embrace of the norms of freedom and equality. They are rather historically integral to and concomitant with that life and these norms. Living freely and equally and analyzing the socio-political structures that enable one and all to live historically and currently in that way must be thought in unison with the "peculiar institution," its history, and the ongoing extent of its ramifications.

Not to do so is to cleave the democratic experiment (the enabling of one and all to live freely and equally in an ongoing way) from any account grappling with the life and afterlife of slavery stamped on the cultural, economic, and political arrangements pertinent to the experiment. Not to do so is to give carte blanche to political theory consigning intellectually that life and afterlife to historical oblivion while conveying an account of that experiment as a rather unproblematic and progressively uninterrupted movement toward freedom and equality. Du Bois is unique as a political theorist, Balfour contends, because he thinks these aspects as always in unison and views all people, especially those of the African-diaspora, as those who should have to live with them jointly for the purpose of constantly re-orienting their comprehension of what democracy requires. Otherwise they continually live with them separated, which has as its consequence acquiescence to undemocratic practices by virtue of an ongoing forgetfulness of deliberate actions and policies of racial injustice.

Balfour seeks to carry out his project in six essays, not through a synoptic view of Du Bois' thought. On one level, she pays homage to Du Bois' intellectual flexibility and readiness to work across disciplines and through manifold genres to present to a reading public the infinity of ways race and racial injustice has infiltrated, with rancor and in silence, the practices and thoughts of a democratic citizenry. But the essays -- on Du Bois' analysis of Reconstruction, on his interpretation of John Brown, on his autobiography of a race concept, on his examination of black women in the context of the "peculiar institution" and the "woman question," and, finally, on the global impact of his thought -- are knitted together and form a complex unity by virtue of three themes Balfour uses to connect them.

Taking up half of the book, Balfour's first theme is what can be called Du Bois' conception of historical temporality. She takes this notion to signify for him the claim of the past on the future-oriented present, specifically the legacy of slavery and racial injustice, which have concrete bearing on democracy and on its analysis in the present. They do not comprise events of some distant past in the democratic experiment, but are integral enactments of its "futures past" or what Balfour calls the "tableau of a present-past" in Du Bois' thought (p. 20). Du Bois does not, for Balfour, historically retrieve the past for the sake of salvaging it, but does so for the sake of delivering it from a stupor and a void threatening to deprive it of any novel role it could assume in a future-oriented present. And she sees the expansion of democracy as requiring a future-oriented present that is at the same time historically redemptive of its past in the fashion just described.

Balfour's example for this point is Du Bois' critique of what he calls in his Black Reconstruction the "American Assumption." This "assumption" is the conviction that affluence is the successful outcome of one's hard work alone and can be the result of each and every one's own effort. It first emerged in conjunction with "King Cotton" predicated on slave labor. The assumption has, however, never been pertinent to the material lives of most Americans. But it subsequently grew steadily in the minds of most of them, steadily separating generations from the wrong of slavery and steadily affirmed that those who profited from that wrong bore no responsibility for it. In effect, Americans have carried this belief in the ethic of individualism and hard work to the current day, despite its longstanding irrelevance to their material lives and despite the fact that it was and continues to be sustained racially (notwithstanding the line of African-Americans running from Booker T. Washington through Herman Cain affirming it) as well as by class.

The assumption's strength and longevity lie in the concealment of its historical genesis from slavery, the suppression of its cultural purpose of holding dear wealth and power rather than labor, and the transference of the burden of the "peculiar institution's" legacy from the nation onto formerly enslaved Africans. For Du Bois, it stifled the expansion of American democracy by bringing to a halt the post-civil war Reconstruction which briefly had enabled formerly enslaved Africans to embrace full citizenship and to commit to economic independence through the proprietorship of land to work, thereby deepening and fortifying the freedom of a nation as a whole. Subsequently, it has continued to throttle any occasion through which obligations acceded to or impressed on contemporary citizens could be better regarded as matters of historical and political inheritance (p. 42).

Balfour shares in the resonance of theorists like Adorno ("What Does Coming to Terms with the Past Mean"), Arendt (Eichmann in Jerusalem), and Habermas (essays on the "Historians' Debate"), who uphold and encourage the power of citizens to remember the "many thousands gone" as a result of politically gross offenses. But she does not believe that current political aspirations and objectives should be relinquished in favor of rectifying such past offenses. Yet, with Du Bois as her guide, Balfour presents his "tableau of the present-past" regarding slavery and its legacy as a counter to what has been called "racial time," i.e., "the temporizing, in the guise of moderation, [which] perpetuates injuries sustained by some members of the polity so that others may be protected" (p. 63). Balfour offers a history that is to whet, not douse, the appetite of a citizenry for acknowledging rather than ignoring the reach of slavery and its continuing effects, with the purpose of reconfiguring democracy's past as a vehicle for its expansion in a future-oriented present.

This history plays out in Balfour’s discussions of reparations and John Brown. Briefly, she does not deny the problems and challenges associated with the compensatory dimension of reparations, does not offer specific proposals concerning reparations, and does not claim that reparations are the palliative for past racial injustice. But, in the light of Du Bois' tableau, she contends that reparations "reorient present-day thinking about what democracy requires and [serve] as a reminder that today's swift dismissals of them are kin to, if not direct offspring of, the disreputable denials of the past" (p. 44), which have provided justification for lasting forgetfulness rather than for a serious well-deserved hearing.

Du Bois' biography John Brown represents for Balfour an interpretation not simply of the life of an individual who believed in the necessity of violence to abolish slavery, but of the life of an individual brought into being by a "political culture of evasion, undergirding the emergence and resurgence of anti-black violence" (p. 59). That "John Brown was right," a view held by Frederick Douglass ("Address at 14th Anniversary of Storer College, Harpers Ferry, 1881"), the current President of the United States, Barack Obama (The Audacity of Hope), as well as Du Bois, to name a few, signals for Balfour a call for "critical recollection rather than revolution" in order to keep "the violence of the past vivid in the present" (p. 69), despite the absence of criteria in Brown for deciding the kind of immediate action to be adopted in the face of injustice.

Balfour's second theme is Du Bois' exploration of what she calls "black exemplarity," a notion primarily, but not exclusively, characterized in his Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept. She is of the mind that Du Bois' text is a self-portrait, investigating his life as an example of living under the color line, and as an exemplar of the surmounting it. Still it is not, Balfour contends, "mere autobiography." Indeed, Du Bois himself said in a 31 March 1961 letter to Paul Partington, "Dusk of Dawn was not an autobiography. It had a great many autobiographical notes, but it was distinctly the story of a theory of race and how it developed in my own life." What path could be taken to understand what is meant here?

One path could lead to Du Bois understanding that his story of a theory of race required interpretive participation in addition to empirical observation. Consequently he would be concerned that his necessary participatory role as an interpreter could threaten the context-independence and value neutrality apparently necessary for the objectivity of his account. But this is a path Balfour does not take. Again, she does not regard Du Bois' text as "mere autobiography." But she still heeds the importance of autobiography as a genre in African-American letters and takes Du Bois to heed its importance as well. Du Bois' assessment of contingent episodes in his life -- putting to the test racial customs and racist strictures or reviewing the steps he happened to take in becoming black and American -- within the larger historical milieu represents "autobiography in the service of democratic thinking" and, she believes, is comparable to the work of William Connolly (p. 88).

Connolly's The Ethos of Pluralization has been directed toward developing the "micropolitics" of democracy, constructing ways citizens in a democracy should embrace identity in terms of the contingency of their own lives in order to become more open to difference and plural ways of life within it. Balfour believes Du Bois' "autobiography" runs rather parallel with Connolly's work, especially around issues of racial identity, since Du Bois' own story of his connection to the power of racial hierarchy both reveals his prior naiveté concerning its power and appraises the contingent episodes in his life wherein he prevails over its impact on his aspirations and his sense of democracy's expansion.

Furthermore, according to Balfour, Du Bois' account foregrounding African-American women's' history in his "The Damnation of Women" also follows the theme of "black exemplarity." Indeed, there is conflict in its representations of black women -- either engaged in resistance against slavery and the poverty of women for the sake of a radical sense of freedom or enthralled with the elegance and loveliness of finer matters consistent with the traditional ideal of racial uplift. Still, this essay presents African-American women as representative of surmounting the "peculiar institution" and its legacy. Du Bois broadens their history as victims of sexual violation to incorporate as their achievements (a) a sexual freedom concomitant with having and raising children irrespective of marital circumstance; (b) an economic independence serving as a model for other women and unfettered by the "American Assumption"; and (c) a political freedom concomitant with full citizenship and their historical significance as agents on the political scene even when not recognized as such agents (pp. 99-100).

Balfour's third and final theme is the global orientation of Du Bois' political thought, serving as a guide for political theory and its current turn toward the global. Du Bois' own global orientation comes very early in his political thought. Indeed, the "problem of the 20th century" as the "problem of the color line" was not just America's problem in The Souls of Black Folk, but the world's problem as well. Indeed, it "belted the world." Balfour is well aware of this point, and she seeks to establish connections between Du Bois' global orientation and the first two themes with her examination of his doctoral dissertation The Suppression of the African Slave-Trade. This text bears a "thoroughgoing worldliness" in its historical investigation and raises issues for a political theory, cosmopolitan in aim, which place such a theory on a "globally constituted 'ground of disadvantage'" (p. 118).

Despite the narrowness of his analysis, Du Bois reveals the persistence of the international slave trade through much of the nineteenth century; and despite the history of endeavors to terminate American participation in the international slave trade, it also reveals the history in which such endeavors were suppressed. The resilience of the slave trade stemmed from the strategic omission of anything about the trade or enslavement in spoken or written discourse, from the lack of will to enforce anti-slavery measures, and from resistance against their passage. For Balfour, Du Bois marries "memories of slavery to memories of the international trade" (p. 125) and marries America to Europe, Africa, and the Caribbean through its collaboration in the trade. Indeed, the abolition of slavery is due not to moral suasion or the "'Liberty' cry of revolution, but to the cutting off of demand for slaves by the closing of West Indian and Southern markets" (p. 125). Given these points, he suggests that Black Haiti, not the United States, is the exemplar, duly representative in the abolition of slavery, as it kindled liberty throughout hemispheric America and gave rise to anti-trade revolutionary activity.

Balfour argues that Du Bois' account should give pause to cosmopolitanism such as Martha Nussbaum's For Love of Country. Such theory tends to detach cosmopolitan aims from the history or "unowned" past of an erstwhile imperialism, as it affirms greater respect for difference and greater concern for the moral relevance of strangers and criticizes current inequalities and injustice around the globe. Although she acknowledges that Du Bois would be strongly appreciative of cosmopolitan aims, she maintains that the lines between 'us' and 'them,' against which a cosmopolitan would fight, would be, for Du Bois, lines frequently "crossed, blurred, and tangled through the international trade in human beings and its legacies" (p. 136).

Political theory, especially with cosmopolitan aims, needs to address not just present inequalities and injustice but also the historical processes through which present inequalities and injustice came into play. The democratic experiment will continue to stagnate if those historical processes are not brought to the fore in order to challenge the omissions that disable appeals to constitutional faith and democracy's expansion. These are the gist of Balfour's claims. Indeed, it would have been quite interesting if she pointed her criticism to political theory as ideal theory with Rawls as its representative. Still, bringing Du Bois to the fore as a political theorist is a fascinating task whose time has come for serious consideration. Alongside Robert Gooding-Williams' In the Shadow of Du Bois, Balfour's book is especially worthy of note.