Democratic Authority and the Separation of Church and State

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Robert Audi, Democratic Authority and the Separation of Church and State, Oxford University Press, 2011, 180pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199796083.

Reviewed by Andrew Koppelman, Northwestern University


"Citizens in a democracy have a prima facie obligation not to advocate or support any law or public policy that restricts human conduct, unless they have, and are willing to offer, adequate secular reason for this advocacy or support (e.g., for a vote)." (65-66) This "principle of secular rationale" articulates a widely shared intuition. Robert Audi has done a great service by offering a sophisticated yet concise philosophical defense of it. The book summarizes, in 155 small pages of text, arguments he has been developing for more than 20 years.[1]It is engagingly written and easy to read, with the analytic clarity that is Audi's great strength.

The first chapter sets forth the relation between ethics, theology, and religion. He argues that a benevolent God could be expected to make sound principles of ethics available to secular reason. Chapter Two states his core principles of separation of church and state, and develops their implications for institutions. Chapter Three considers individual ethics, in particular the obligations of citizens when they support coercive laws. Chapter Four develops an account of civic virtue in the liberal state, offering principles of tolerance and forgiveness that should be followed in cases of intractable disagreement.

Audi's argument can be understood as a pair of concentric circles, with his core principle of secular rationale at the center surrounded by a host of qualifications and modifications in response to criticisms. The qualifications are elaborate: the principle should not be a serious burden on religion if religion is properly understood; religious people are not unduly constrained from participating in politics by the principle; they can offer their religious views so long as they simultaneously offer fully adequate secular reasons for the policies they support; they can legitimately try to accomplish by persuasion what should not be legislated; churches can take moral positions, even politically controversial ones; some support for religion, such as education vouchers, is permissible so long as it is provided under a nonreligious description; failures to live up to the principle may be excusable. On the other hand, in some respects the principle is quite demanding. I may not advocate a law for religious reasons unless I also have a secular basis for my political view, and I must search my soul to be sure that my real motivation is secular and not religious. If I fail in this introspective quest, if my being persuaded by the secular reasons is self-deceptive rationalization (141), then I am reprehensible even if my secular reasons are fully adequate.

The core principle rests on three grounds: epistemological, consequentialist, and a norm of reciprocity. The epistemological one holds that coercion is unjustified among epistemic peers who disagree about whether coercion in that instance is warranted. (118-20) This argument assumes the "conformist" position concerning epistemological disagreement, which holds that peer disagreement should lead one to revise the strength of one's beliefs. But this is a controversial view.[2] Politics is all about contests with our epistemic peers about the appropriate uses of coercion. The fact that you see no value in the bald eagle is a datum, not a defeater, in evaluating the case for its legal protection.

The consequentialist ground depends on the unique danger of religion for democracy. Religious disagreement can produce "avoidable trouble and perhaps serious strife." (94) "Many people are prone to violence in the service of their holy causes." (139) "There may be no way on earth to make peace so long as people oppose one another under the banner of their clashing religious doctrines." (86) This may have some connection to the epistemic problem. What is inaccessible to other citizens is "religious experience or sheer religious authority." (92)

The strife may be rooted in a violation of the norm of reciprocity. "Rational citizens may properly resent coercion based essentially on someone else's religious convictions; adequate secular reasons are not objectionable on that ground." (76) Here everything depends on what "adequate" means. If I'm being coerced for reasons that I don't think adequate, it's not clear why I should be comforted by the fact that those reasons are secular.

The claim that religion is uniquely disruptive is not intelligible or falsifiable unless the boundaries of the category "religion" are knowable. Audi, however, thinks we don't need a clear definition of religion (72). William Cavanaugh has shown that the distinction between religion, understood as a distinctively unstable and dangerous set of beliefs, and patriotism, imagined as a stabilizing and valid reason to kill and die, is part of the legitimizing mythology of the modern state.[3] Audi implicitly embraces that mythology when he claims that a nonreligious politics will be more peaceful. In America -- and I shall shortly argue that Audi is responding to recent developments in American politics -- religiously motivated political action has been almost entirely nonviolent.

Audi's central concern is coercive law. There is a prima facie obligation not to coerce others. Coercion negates liberty and creates inequality, because the coerced person is not the equal of the coercer. (40) This creates a presumption against almost any law, because "most laws and public policies are also coercive." (60) The principle of secular rationale seems to be motivated largely by the desire to throw obstacles in the path of coercion. The principle of secular rationale "does not even rule out having only nonreligious reasons for lifting oppression or expanding liberty." (68)

Audi is eager to proliferate such obstacles, as with his strange "principle of religious rationale," which holds that when religious citizens support coercive laws, they ought to offer both religious and secular reasons, each of which is sufficient to justify the law. (89) The only effect this could have would be to bar religious people from supporting laws when they have sufficient secular reasons to do so, reasons that would be fully justifying if a nonreligious person supported them, unless they also have a religious justification. Churches likewise are under burdens that no other civic entities share: they "have a prima facie obligation to abstain from supporting candidates for public office or pressing for laws or public policies that restrict human conduct, particularly religious or other basic liberties." (95) He adds that churches' social role is compromised by their involvement in politics. (96) (The possibility that churches may have a different vision of their appropriate social role is not discussed.) Anything that keeps religion away from politics appears to be pro tanto good.

Audi seems to presume that liberty is maximized in the absence of law. That is why it is good to place obstacles in the path of regulation. In fact, however, government regulation frees us to do lots of things we could not otherwise do. Frequently there are tradeoffs between some liberties and others, as with the prohibition of discrimination or the protection of the environment (both of which happen to be objects of disagreement among epistemic peers). The state also provides public goods, such as roads and bridges, to say nothing of funding for the arts or for basic scientific research. A presumption against government action does not necessarily make us freer or happier. It depends on the status quo that exists without government.

Audi thinks the state may restrict liberty -- that is the only state action he discusses -- if and only if such a restriction is consistent with Mill's harm principle. This relies on a common reading of Mill, who however was primarily concerned with paternalistic restrictions on liberty and never tried to enumerate alleged harms that should not count as reasons for restricting liberty.[4] Audi allows that harm to "the environment" can justify coercion (62), but such harm could be construed broadly, to include harm to the moral environment. That, of course, would legitimate just the kind of liberty-restricting coercion that Audi detests.

Audi writes that "liberty should be as extensive as it can be within the limits of a plausible interpretation of the harm principle." (57) John Rawls once embraced a similar principle, but was eventually persuaded that liberty is not a simple quantity you can maximize. You have to decide which liberties are important.[5] Audi seems to understand this when he gives special emphasis to religious liberty. He proposes what he calls the "protection of identity principle," which protects the expression of commitments that play a major role in determining a person's sense of identity. (If Audi's Millean liberty-maximizing principle is accepted, it is mysterious what this principle adds to it, unless my identity-defining commitments are to be a license to harm others.) He claims that "few if any" non-religious commitments satisfy this principle in the way that religious ones do. (42-43) Do the nonreligious not have any central, identity-defining commitments? Evidently he is here trying to show the religion-friendly character of his argument by rationalizing the well-established practice of accommodating religion, but feels he must do it under some description other than the fact of its being religious.

Who is Audi's intended audience? He spends much of his scarce space developing claims of rational religion, for example that "literal interpretation of scripture throughout is not a requirement of a reasonable theology and is increasingly rejected by educated Biblical interpreters." (49) A benevolent God, he argues, can be assumed to make ethical truth available to us through our reason unaided by revelation. Anyone who accepts these arguments won't give any weight to religious experience, clergy authority or biblical literalism, if these conflict with secular reasons. Such a person would automatically follow the principle of secular rationale without having to think about it, because she already thinks that secular rationale is the most reliable path to religious truth. But, of course, not everyone shares Audi's theological views. Less rationalistic believers are unlikely to be moved by contingent considerations of political divisiveness, nor to concede the epistemic parity of those to whom the Truth has not yet been revealed. So it is hard to imagine what work the principle of secular rationale is supposed to do, other than to provide secularists with the comforting thought that their adversaries who introduce their religious views into politics are bad citizens.

The principles of church-state separation that he advocates are, he writes, "required by any sound theory of democratic authority." (39) Revealingly, though, the picture on the cover of the book is Christy's painting of the signing of the U.S. Constitution. The principles advocated here are characteristically American, obviously rooted in the experience of the United States, and particularly of the last several decades. Beginning in the 1980s, when the religious right first became a potent force in American politics, Americans became increasingly hostile to the involvement of religious leaders in politics, and this hostility was strongest among those who did not identify with any religion.[6] Political theorists piled onto this bandwagon, crafting increasingly sophisticated arguments to show that it was immoral and disrespectful to make religious arguments about political matters. Religious thinkers responded bitterly that such a limitation on public discourse would deprive politics of important moral resources and deny them the right to state what they believe. A doctrine that purports to be grounded in universal respect left a lot of actual citizens feeling profoundly insulted. It would have been better to focus criticism directly on the retrograde politics of the religious right rather than on its religiosity.

Audi's principle of religious rationale is not part of American government, but there are related principles of religious neutrality that accomplish much of what he hopes for. Government is not permitted to establish an official theology, not even the rationalist natural theology that Audi supports. This is why, for example, school prayers (including bland, state-composed prayers consistent with Audi's rationalistic theism) are prohibited. But American courts police outputs, not inputs, of policymaking. Any law is permissible, no matter who supported it or why, so long as it has a plausible secular purpose. Religious citizens are full participants in democratic politics, but are forbidden to establish an orthodoxy. These restrictions may have something to do with America's success at moderating religious tensions at the same time that it has become the most religiously diverse society in history.[7]

This is an important book, because it is the latest statement of a widely held position by one of the leading writers in the field. Its brevity, however, is a liability, because Audi is at his best when he is working out his argument in detail. Audi's other work, most notably Religious Commitment and Secular Reason (Cambridge University Press, 2000), offers fuller defenses of his views on these matters. The compression with which they appear here gives the discussion an ipse dixit quality. For this reason, that earlier book would be a better teaching tool, since the arguments are more clearly on display there.

[1] See Robert Audi, "The Separation of Church and State and the Obligations of Citizenship," Philosophy & Public Affairs 18(1989): 259-296.

[2] Jennifer Lackey, "Epistemology of Disagreement," Oxford Bibliographies Online: Philosophy (accessed 30-Dec-2011). The most pertinent response in the context of religious disagreement, one that gets almost no attention from Audi, is Christopher J. Eberle, Religious Conviction in Liberal Politics (Cambridge University Press, 2002).

[3] William T. Cavanaugh, The Myth of Religious Violence: Secular Ideology and the Roots of Modern Conflict(Oxford University Press, 2009).

[4] Audi acknowledges that Mill's "notion of harm is seriously vague" (160) but does not acknowledge how this unfits Mill for Audi's purposes.

[5] See John Rawls, Political Liberalism, 331-34 (Columbia University Press, 1993).

[6] The refusal of religious affiliation appears to be an effect, rather than a cause, of the rejection of the politics of the religious right. See Robert D. Putnam & David E. Campbell, American Grace: How Religion Divides and Unites Us, 120-32 (Simon & Schuster, 2010).

[7] This account of American law is elaborated in Andrew Koppelman, Defending American Religious Neutrality(Harvard University Press, forthcoming 2012).