Democritus: Science, the Arts, and the Care of the Soul

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Aldo Brancacci and Pierre-Marie Morel (eds.), Democritus: Science, the Arts, and the Care of the Soul, Brill, 2006, 354pp., $170.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004151604.

Reviewed by Patricia Curd, Purdue University


The study of Democritus can be frustrating, even for a scholar familiar with the vicissitudes of Presocratic studies. The ancient lists of his works are long, yet little survives. He was probably an important influence on Plato's moral psychology, yet the largest collection of ethical fragments, most of the so-called "Democrates" fragments, are banal, and their authorship is disputed. Democritus is known best among philosophers for his atomism, yet there are few direct sources for that theory, and little to help us see how his atomism connects with other aspects of his thought. His links with other fifth-century thinkers have been under-appreciated.

This volume aims to redress some of these problems. One of the first major collections to focus on Democritus since the publications of the proceedings of the Catania conference of 1979 and the Xanthi symposium of 1983, Democritus: Science, the Arts, and the Care of the Soul brings together scholars from disparate backgrounds in order to, in the editors' words, "concentrate … attention on relatively neglected areas of research on Democritus and on themes on which it is legitimate to expect new contributions, and finally new interpretive suggestions" (p. 1). The book contains eleven essays in addition to the Introduction; five of the essays are in French, the remainder in English. The collection certainly succeeds in showing how much of the breadth of Democritus' interests can be reconstructed from the sources, and provides an excellent overview of recent scholarship. The question of the unity of Democritean thought remains open, for there is not much here that addresses that issue directly. This is perhaps disappointing, but not a flaw, for these essays are contributions that will form the foundation for the sort of second-order, unifying theorizing that will, one hopes, come next. The editors' introduction provides a brief history of Democritus studies from the nineteenth century, noting how even from the beginning, scholars tended to focus on either the physical fragments or the ethical ones. The last twenty years or so have seen a resurgence in Democritus studies (as part of a more general revival of interest in Presocratic philosophy), and more attention is being paid to the Democritean corpus as a whole.

Just what do we have and what do we know of Democritus? In the opening essay, "Democritus' works: from their titles to their contents," Walter Leszl tackles the problem of works attributed to Democritus, comparing Thrasyllus' catalogue of titles with lists from other sources. Exploring the sources and methods of Thrasyllus, he attempts to separate the genuine from the spurious and determine the subjects of the Democritean works. This is painstaking detective work: scholars may disagree with some of the details, especially arguments about which works must be spurious, but Leszl lays the groundwork for future inquiries.

The "care of the soul" aspect of the volume is introduced as C.C.W. Taylor compares and contrasts two versions of atomism in "Democritus and Lucretius on the death and dying." If death is defined as the loss of soul, then differences between Democritus and Lucretius will reflect differing views of the nature of soul. Because both are atomists, those differences will depend on their differing accounts of atoms and the structures of living things as constituted by atoms. On Democritus' view, Taylor argues, the soul "is a web of spherical and hence highly mobile atoms permeating the entire structure of the body" (p. 77). Taylor examines several texts to marshal support for this view. Moreover, Taylor argues that the evidence is strong that for Democritus all soul atoms are alike; there is no distinction between rational and non-rational soul atoms, and so sensation and thought take place throughout the body, as it were, rather than being concentrated in a mind. For Democritus, then, death is a process: lose enough soul atoms and an animal dies; although life has ceased, some soul functions (twitches) may continue if the concentration of soul atoms is strong enough, albeit below the threshold for conscious life. The Epicureans rejected this: there is no residual soul function after death. Taylor makes the case that Lucretius argues for this by distinguishing the mind from the rest of the soul. The complicated argument requires four different types of soul atoms, as well as distinctions between the seat of perception in the chest (animus) and the rest of the soul (anima) throughout the body. The smallest, most mobile atoms are, for Lucretius, "the soul of the soul," but they are also spread through the body and so cannot simply be identified with the mind (pp. 80-81). It is the loss of the animus that constitutes death, and so, there can be no consciousness after death, though motion may continue in various body parts. This is a tricky theory, that requires a fuller account than Lucretius gives.

But Taylor has revealed how later atomists could reject (as they did) Democritus' allowance for perception after death, and the apparent phenomenon of rekindling a spark of life in one who seems to be dead. The argument depends as much on physics as on philosophy of mind: how do physical differences in atoms affect the properties of structure that the atoms make up? James Warren considers this in connection with Democritus' physics in his "Democritus on social and psychological harm." Democritus matter-of-factly asserts that enemies (and possible enemies) are to be killed (B258, B259, and B260, e.g.) and claims that this is a matter of justice. How can a mechanistic atomist provide moral justification for such claims? Warren finds the answer in the atomist accounts of emotions and of eidola, and gives a fine analysis of these perplexing aspects of Democritus' theory. For Democritus, psychic states involve motions of atoms; motions that disturb the good functioning of the whole organism are undesirable (or bad). Eidola emitted by those in psychic upset maintain that state as they travel outwards (for, as we have already seen, Democritean soul atoms extend throughout the body and will, Warren suggests, be part of the outer layer of atoms sloughed off as eidola are emitted). When these thin sheets or layers of atoms meet another person, the soul atoms throughout that person are affected and moved and so the first state of mind can be transmitted to another person. Bad thoughts or harmful intentions without actual actions can be so transmitted and this is harmful. As Warren says

Democritus is able to offer a physical, atomist account of the mechanism of interpersonal psychic harm… . There is no reason in principle why this should be restricted to cases of intentional malevolent magic, or the 'evil eye.' Rather this mechanism provides a neat atomist explanation of a range of phenomena (p. 99).

We may reasonably be reluctant to accept the theory, but here Democritus is consistent in blending his physics with his psychology and ethics.

What do we mean when we speak of physics in Democritus? In a lucid study, "Démocrite et l'objet de la philosophie naturelle: A propos des sens de physis chez Démocrite," Pierre-Marie Morel attempts to untangle the various ways we can consider physis in Democritus. A careful examination of sources and texts leads Morel to conclude that there is no single sense of nature at work. He suggests that Democritus did not write a book called On Nature, for the concept is too porous to allow for such a single-minded treatment (according to Morel, "la nature ne désigne pas directement le Tout, sauf dans les transcriptions doxagraphiques de l'idée de reserve atomique universelle" (p. 119), rather there are many functions performed by physis" depending on the level of explanation that concerns Democritus at any given point. Atoms (and void, too, if we are to believe Plutarch) have fixed and unchanging natures, and there is a stable nature for the compounds of atoms that we call persons and olive trees (so, for Democritus we can recognize that certain psychic states are generally bad for persons in general because they disrupt those natures). Yet, a particular individual character at a given time can also be called a nature, as when Democritus says (B33), "Nature (physis) and teaching are similar; for teaching reshapes the man, and in reshaping makes his nature (physiopoiei)" (Taylor's translation, my punctuation). Here, physis cannot refer to the nature of human being in general. There are rich insights in the Morel piece: he brings together the physical, technical and ethical sides of Democritus in the study of physis, and he provides a salutary reminder that terms that now have technical meanings for us began their philosophical careers in much less rigid circumstances. Expecting a single notion of physis in any of the Presocratics will lead us astray as we try to understand them on their own terms.

Democritus' accounts of knowledge and perception are discussed in Jean Salem's "Perception et connaissance chez Démocrite." Salem notes, as others have, that there seems to be a misfit between Democritus' views on the nature of knowledge and the roles of experience and perceptions. Sextus famously seemed to enroll Democritus among the sceptics, insofar as the senses are untrustworthy sources (B6, B7, B8, B9, B10, B11). Diogenes Laertius attributes to Democritus the claim that "in reality (eteé) we know nothing, for truth is in the depths" (B117 tr. Taylor). Yet the fundamental tenet of Democritean theory is that "in reality" (eteé) there are "atoms and void" (B9). Salem notes the primary role given to perception in Democritus, yet leaves open the possibility of a "double approach" (using a notion suggested by Couloubaritsis). Here, says Salem, "la cas de la double justification concernant la thèse en vertu de laquelle le nombre des formes d'atomes est nécessairement infini, paraît, à cet égard, tout à fait édifiant" (p. 139). The problem is whether there is any reconciliation between the two: are we simply left with the realm of sense and the realm of reason? Democritus seems to think not, yet it is difficult to see what happens when the bastard judgment gives way to the genuine (B11), and just how the genuine makes use of the evidence of the senses. Salem ends with a short coda on mathematics, suggesting that even here there is a "double approach" by the two kinds of judgment.

From general accounts of aspects of Democritus' views the volume turns to some special studies, and it is here that the editors' promise of explorations of relatively neglected areas begins to be fulfilled. Lorenzo Perilli carefully analyzes the fragments and testimonia that deal with animals, and argues that Democritus was less original in this area than had been thought. Other Presocratics were interested in animal taxonomy and physiology, but Perilli finds the most important influences on Democritus to be from the medical tradition. This conclusion is supported by careful analyses of the Hippocratic treatises and by well-constructed case studies of Democritus' views on embryology and on the growth of horns. Perilli is convincing in suggesting that Democritus made a careful study of available handbooks and medical texts, and drew on other sources of animal studies. Perilli's claim that "Democritus … seems to pick up data coming from the most up-to-date investigations in order to obtain reliable means to explain various and more general phenomena" would give to Democritus a methodology entirely consistent with his own views about the bastard judgment of the senses and the more legitimate judgment of reason. Perilli stresses the importance of Democritus' atomism for his animal studies: order and structure are important notions here, and can be supplied by atomic arrangements. Using his atomism to explain the phenomena, Democritus explains the perceptible by means of what is available only to thought. Perilli's Democritus is more philosophical theorist than original scientist, but many of those titles and studies attributed to Democritus begin to cohere if we think of him as systematizing through his atomism.

A series of those titles is connected with mousika (a whole section of Thrasyllus' edition has that title, and Diogenes Laertius tells us that there were eight works belonging to that group). Aldo Brancacci explores these with a close and careful study of Democritus' conception of music and poetry. He clearly sets out the boundaries of his analysis: he will consider fragments and testimonia that meet his criteria for being genuine. Using those to construct an account of Democritus' views, one could then go on to work with the more questionable material. Brancacci works through the catalogue, attempting to determine contents, and demonstrates both the traditional and the innovative aspects of Democritus' views. Brancacci makes a solid case for seeing Democritus in the context of a tradition that goes back to the earliest Greek poetry; in this his contribution is further support for the overall view of Democritus that emerges in the volume. Nevertheless, as Brancacci argues, Democritus also made theoretical contributions that are uniquely his own. Democritus suggests that music and other such richly appealing intellectual arts and sciences only appear once a certain prosperity beyond the mere necessities of life is reached; this view is followed by Aristotle in Metaphysics I. Yet Democritus denies that the disciplines studied under the rubric of mousika were merely pleasurable frills: Brancacci makes the case that Democritus "included music, together with grammata manthanein and gymnastics, among the activities contributing to the acquisition of aidós and thus to the realization of human virtue (areté), its intimate value lying in the ability to form the feeling of honor (aidós)." Again we can see how the Democritean system fits together: mousika forms the right sorts of attitudes and thoughts through the study and practice of good rhythm; learning to appreciate proper order literally forms one's character by shaping the arrangements of atoms.

M. Laura Gemelli Marciano continues the exploration of some traditionally overlooked and undervalued areas of Democritus studies. In "La Démocrite technicien. Remarques sur la reception de Démocrite dans la littérature technique" she argues that scholars have been too quick to reject aspects of the Democritean corpus that do not seem sufficiently "atomic" or "philosophical." She discusses the ancient technical books on medicine, cookery, and agriculture and explores technical information on agriculture and the weather and on medicine that can be traced to Democritus. Gemelli Marciano builds evidence for the case that Democritus was a genuine polymath, who made contributions to many fields (she thus puts more stress than some contributors on Democritus the innovator).

The next two papers discuss Democritus as a philosopher discussed by other philosophers. Denis O'Brien (in "Démocrite à l'Académie?") argues that Epicurus makes changes to Democritus' account of the indivisibility of atoms. Democritean atoms are uncuttable because of their hardness, but Epicurus has a much more sophisticated view: the atom "est constituté de parties qu'il appelle des 'limites'; mais la nature de ces 'limites' est telle qu'acune ne peut subsister indépendamment d'une autre" (p. 239). So, there is not simply a physical resistance to cutting for Epicurus, there are logical constraints on being an atom that prevent its being cut. O'Brien makes the point clearly: in Aristotelian terms, an atom is an element, and parts or limits of elements are not elements (p. 241). O'Brien explores the subtleties of the Epicurean view, arguing that it is a response to Aristotelian objections to Democritean atoms, and raises the question: can it be that his response to Aristotle put Epicurus squarely into the Academy, with a view in which the limits of Epicurean atoms play the roles of the 'sub-elementary' triangles in the Timaeus? O'Brien notes a certain poetic justice here: Plato was no doubt thinking of and criticizing Democritus (among others) as he wrote the Timaeus; Epicurus is responding to Aristotelian criticisms of both Democritus and Plato with his new conception of atoms. How satisfying if Epicurus ends up with a Platonic view.

Aristotle returns in Annick Jaulin's "Démocrite au Lycée: la definition." She argues that despite Aristotle's strong criticisms of Democritus, he is influenced by Democritus in formulating his own account of definitions. Jaulin takes Aristotle's compliment to Democritus in De Gen. et Corr. (315a34ff) as evidence that Aristotle finds in Democritus a methodology that is acceptable and usable for his own devices. Aristotle says that only Democritus paid more than superficial attention to the phenomena of generation, and of growth and decay: Democritus not only thought about the problems but was distinguished from the others by thinking, as Jaulin puts it, about "how (comment [pós]) things come about. " With Democritus, she claims, "un débat sur 'le comment' est possible" (p. 267). Jaulin then attempts to find proto-Aristotelian views about difference and definition in Democritus, mainly by examining the Aristotelian texts. This is one area where the lack of Democritean texts presents a serious hurdle, for it is difficult to evaluate the strength of his arguments.

The volume closes with Jaap Mansfeld on Philoponus on Democritus. In "Out of touch. Philoponus as a source for Democritus," Mansfeld takes on the sticky problem of whether or not Democritean atoms can touch. There is conflicting evidence, which Mansfeld subjects to scrupulous examination. The main evidence against the notion that atoms can collide comes from Philoponus, but Mansfeld argues Philoponus is a sloppy commentator who has no direct evidence for Democritus. Thus, his evidence cannot be taken seriously. Philoponus denies that atoms touch "in the strict sense;" that strict sense is one in which "surfaces fit over one another." (Mansfeld notes that this notion is not found in any of Aristotle's definitions of touch.) Mansfeld traces Philoponus' confusion to his discussions of Democritus on the motions of atoms when they move around but are not parts of compounds, and to Philoponus' own problems in understanding atomic attraction. Philoponus' difficulties are compounded when Aristotle conflates the views of earlier thinkers in discussing his own ideas. Thus, we have a discouraging picture of Philoponus as an unreliable source on the nature of Democritean atoms. Mansfeld concludes that early atomists could have ("perhaps naively") thought that "the great hardness and solidity of atoms would prevent their breaking up at the momentary crash of one into another" (p. 292).

This is not a collection aimed at beginners; moreover the price is prohibitive for graduate seminar use (students will want to begin with A. E. Taylor's Phoenix Presocratic Series volume on the Atomists [University of Toronto Press, 1999]). The excellent essays are generally written at a high level of scholarship that demands familiarity with a variety of fields and sources. The contributions are each splendid sources of material: most authors include critical discussions of the history of scholarship in their areas, the notes are full, and the common bibliography long. There are three indexes (although the entries in the Index Nominum and the Index Rerum are not further divided into sub-headings, making it difficult to search for a particular topic in a particular context). The book is nicely produced in the Brill manner, which helps somewhat to justify the high price. For advanced Presocratic scholars and researchers, the volume is an excellent resource that will, no doubt, further inquiry into the riches of Democritus.