Demonstration and Scientific Knowledge in William of Ockham

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John Lee Longeway, Demonstration and Scientific Knowledge in William of Ockham: A Translation of Summa Logicae III-II: De Syllogismo Demonstrativo, and Selections from the Prologue to the Ordinatio, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 460pp., $58.00 (hbk), ISBN 0268033781.

Reviewed by André Goddu, Stonehill College


William of Ockham (d. 1347/1348) did not write commentaries on Aristotle's Prior or Posterior Analytics.  His summaries in the Summa Logicae (henceforth SL) along with relevant questions discussed in his Prologue to Book I of his Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard stand in place of complete and formal commentaries.  Translations of SL I (by M. Loux) on terms and II (by A. Freddoso) on propositions have already been published by the University of Notre Dame. SL III consists of Ockham's treatment of arguments, and contains four sections, the first on the syllogism (III-I), the second on the demonstrative syllogism (III-II), the third on consequences (III-III), and the fourth on fallacies (III-IV).  Parts III-I, corresponding to the Prior Analytics, III-III and III-IV have not yet been translated in full.           

The introduction alone is worth the price of the book.  In this review I summarize and comment on the introduction, and turn to the translation and commentary where I add some additional comments on the Latin edition of SL.

Readers familiar with the best recent studies of Ockham's thought will find that the exposition offers clarity and context. Even where the judgments require qualification, the analysis confirms why Ockham remains such an important thinker in the history of western philosophy. In this respect Longeway does not mince words: "[Ockham] is the founder of European empiricism" (p. 1).  "Ockham may reasonably be regarded as the founder of empiricism in the European tradition" (p. 3).  It takes a close and comparative reading of Ockham's treatise on the demonstrative syllogism to justify those judgments, but Longeway provides just that.

In the introduction, Longeway summarizes Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, Robert Grosseteste's Commentary (which Ockham knew well), the views of Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, Henry of Ghent, and Giles of Rome.

Aristotle's doctrine of scientific demonstration has caused no little grief in the commentary tradition.  The experts continue to disagree about his intention or the purpose of scientific demonstration. Be that as it may, medieval scholastic thinkers did try to come to grips with the requirements for scientific demonstration and lesser or looser forms of demonstration. Longeway's summary of this tradition by way of important representatives cannot substitute for a complete history, but it illuminates the fundamental issues and the crucial decisions that influenced Ockham's own account. 

Grosseteste's Augustinian Neoplatonic metaphysics led him to transform Aristotle's doctrine about each subject with its own principles into a model that is a sort of inversion of Neoplatonic emanationism. Longeway says, ambiguously, that Grosseteste, like Ockham, "was associated with the Franciscan order."  Ockham was a Franciscan and died thinking that he was still one.  Grosseteste was a secular priest, a professor, and later Bishop of Lincoln.  He influenced the Franciscans, who first arrived at Oxford in 1224, and in his capacity as bishop protected them.  Many Franciscans found his Augustinian illuminationism congenial.  How did Ockham find anything of value in Grosseteste's interpretation?

Longeway devotes thirty-two pages to explicating Grosseteste's doctrine. Grosseteste thought that Aristotle attempted to present his doctrine of demonstration in demonstrative form wherever he could, an approach that Ockham adopts in SL.  Conceived as it is with finding middle terms and definitions, demonstration, on this view, is an art of discovery.  Christian theologians, worried about the unrelieved naturalism of Aristotle's philosophy, found in Grosseteste's interpretation a philosophy suited to post-lapsarian humanity.  This also appealed to Ockham, although Longeway does not seem to notice it -- a dimension that becomes abundantly clear in Ockham's polemical works.

Typical of Ockham, he adopted a reductivist interpretation of Grosseteste's "light metaphysics." Again, Longeway does not comment directly on this feature of Ockham's treatment of perspectivist authors (an analysis that goes beyond SL III-II), yet Ockham's reduction of the metaphysical entities to mathematical descriptions were inspired by Grosseteste's theory, and it supports conclusions reached by Longeway.

Longeway emphasizes Grosseteste's conclusion that a simple intellectual vision of a thing's nature is not sufficient to reveal its causal activity -- only experience of its causal activity can achieve such knowledge.  Ockham will drive the point further by focusing on the conditions under which the mind forms concepts -- a key to Ockham's empiricist epistemology.

Likewise, Grosseteste's conclusion that only in mathematics can we obtain the highest kind of demonstration in this life is taken over by Ockham, although Ockham's reason is that "only in mathematics can we see clearly the structure that realizes a reality, and from which its attributes arises" (p.347, n.71).

Natural science falls short of the highest form of demonstration because natural causes do not invariably produce their effects without other conditions being fulfilled such as the removal of impediments.  We can reformulate the propositions so as to express their universality and necessity, but the reformulation is conditional in form, not demonstrative in the highest sense. Demonstration in natural science cannot be propter quid but only quia, because while we may be able to guess the causal structure of an event, it merely indicates how a natural operation occurs.  This issue touches on middle terms and definitions, what much of the scholastic debate was about, by means of which Longeway shows the differences between the great thirteenth-century commentators and Ockham. 

Ockham found something of value in the arguments and conclusions of his predecessors and contemporaries, bent to his own purposes.  The authors cited influenced Ockham, even if dialectically, much of which can be gleaned from the clear tables that Longeway provides on pp. 142-151.

Turning to Ockham in section 5 of his introduction (p. 101-140), we may focus on a few comments and corrections.

The brief biographical sketch requires some cautionary remarks.  Some details remain hypothetical, but rather than point out all of them, I refer the reader to the following: W. Courtenay, "Ockham, Chatton, and the London Studium: Observations on Recent Changes in Ockham's Biography," in Die Gegenwart Ockhams, ed. W. Vossunkuhl et al. (Weinheim, 1990), pp. 327-337; idem, "The Academic and Intellectual Worlds of Ockham," in The Cambridge Companion to Ockham, ed. P. Spade (1999), pp. 17-30.  Virtually every line of Longeway's brief sketch requires qualification, the most relevant of which concerns the Quodlibeta, which he cites.  It is true that Ockham began writing those disputations before 1324, but he completed, revised, and edited them in Avignon between 1324 and 1328, probably completed in 1325.  It may have been John of Reading rather than John Lutterell who instigated the action against Ockham in 1324.           

The looseness of that paragraph is fortunately atypical of Longeway's treatment, and I make only three more additions to his bibliography.  By far the most comprehensive work on Ockham is J. Miethke, Ockhams Weg zur Sozialphilosophie (Berlin, 1969), the only work that treats Ockham's total output in depth and shows how his philosophical and theological works are connected with the works of his polemical period.  This is not meant to dispute Longeway's admiration for M. Adams's William Ockham, an admiration that I share.  The introduction should also refer to C. Panaccio on connotative concepts.  A representative example is "Semantics and Mental Language" in The Cambridge Companion, pp. 53-75.  I would also add a reference to A. Maurer, The Philosophy of William of Ockham in the Light of Its Principles (Toronto, 1999) for its readability and fairness.  One minor criticism: Longeway consistently misspells Sten Ebbesen's name.

Such comments are frankly quibbles, for despite them I admire Longeway's introduction greatly.  Reading Ockham's texts even in an excellent translation like this does not make the significance of his ideas readily apparent. Ockham took the principles of scientific demonstration rigorously.  His distinctions between absolute and connotative concepts and real and nominal definitions, his account of intuitive and abstractive cognition, and his claim that there are sources of evident cognition other than scientific demonstration, -- all of these contributed to Ockham's conclusion that only in mathematics can we achieve the highest form of demonstration.  See Longeway's Table 6 and p. 360, n. 214, however, for the details, including those cases in which attributes can be demonstrated, but not in the highest form of demonstration.  With respect to the demonstration of essence, attributes, and cause, we cannot meet the rigorous conditions of strict demonstration in natural science.  Ockham allowed for lesser forms of demonstration, and while demonstration remains an ideal, Ockham's account leads to the conclusion that necessary propositions about contingent things must be conditional, leaving us with a relatively more open ended view of what we can know with certainty about the natural world.  This is an outcome that supports the inclusion of Ockham under the more empiricist thinkers of our tradition. In several places Longeway makes this result abundantly clear.  Because the connection between the attribute and its subject outside mathematics, in the natural sciences, is always causal, and causal connections are not known through the examination of concepts or real natures [real definitions] alone, but only through experience of relevant causal activity (pp. 114-136), then only in mathematics can we achieve the highest form of demonstration.  It is tempting to expand this observation into claims about the "direction" in which Ockham's restriction would put mechanics at the center of natural science.  Ockham did not do so, as Longeway acknowledges, but others adopting his skeptical doubts and repudiating substantial form as a term of explanation might propose a "materialist reduction" (pp. 115-116).

It is, of course, the case that Ockham does not reject substantial form, but Longeway does himself a slight disservice here by not explaining the limitations of relying mostly on Ockham's doctrine of scientific demonstration, which leaves one to argue ex silentio.  Second, Longeway does not take sufficient advantage of Ockham's assumption that a quality can have causal powers, which Longeway mentions (p. 369, n. 25).  Ockham's doctrines on consequence, topical syllogism, dialectical reasoning, probable knowledge, rejection or reinterpretation of species, and his application of connotation-theory in natural philosophy provide support for his views on the relation between mathematics and natural philosophy and for his empiricism.  What Longeway does show, however, is that Ockham was in possession of an alternative account of knowledge and certitude, and so was not subject to the anxieties that plagued Descartes and other seventeenth-century rationalists. I would add that Ockham's emphasis on God's freedom and his application of the doctrine of potentia absoluta says less about God and God's intentions and more about human reliance on experience and rational argument to be open to possibilities that are foreclosed by the all-too-neat and inseparable links of the Platonic vision.

I conclude this review with a few comments and specific questions related to the translation and commentary.  I can register one complaint now.  I suppose that there are practical reasons for the placement of footnotes at the back, but in this day of computer-ready copy, it is hard to accept.  This translation is not user-friendly in that regard; I must have flipped back and forth about eight hundred times!

In only three cases does Longeway suggest an emendation of the now standard edition of SL III-II (ed. P. Boehner, G. Gál, and S. Brown, St. Bonaventure, 1974).  The edition of SL, as the introduction to that volume points out, was not a collation from all manuscripts, but from a number of "families," and one edition.  Two earlier editors despaired of constructing a stemma codicum, and the modern editors (Gál and Brown) adopted a pragmatic approach that brought their efforts to a conclusion in a reasonable amount of time.  In my view, their decision was justified.  The first two emendations (SL III-II, 3, ed., p. 508, line 21; and III-II, 5, ed., p. 512, line 24) are not supported by any of the collated manuscripts.  The first, a substitution of "si" for "sed," can also be achieved by making the clause that begins with "sed" a new complete sentence.  The second, a substitution of "quia" for "quin" is also unnecessary, although Longeway's translation reads better.

The third (pp. 204 and 387, n. 187) is a case where Longeway's emendation is correct, in my view.  Here, however, there is a variant that supports it, but it is not a manuscript.  Longeway includes it among the manuscripts (p. 387, n. 187), but "E" refers to a version of Marc of Benevento's edition from 1508 (SL, ed., p. 71* and Sigla Codicum).  Boehner complained that this edition was full of typographical errors and misreadings, and perhaps because of the errors and because none of the collated manuscripts supported the emendation, the editors did not make the change in the text.  But the variant (even if in a faulty early edition) supports Longeway's emendation here.  In short, whatever the technical details, Longeway's translations are correct, and for readers dependent on the translation, that is all that matters.

On one somewhat thorny issue (SL III-II, 5), the interpretation of assertoric propositions about possibles (also SL I, 32 and 72; II, 7-11; III-I, 41; III-III, 10-12), I am inclined to agree with Longeway against Freddoso (tr., Theory of Propositions, pp. 52-61) concerning propositions with a supposition for possibly existing things, and that they could not be true if there were no such things at all.  Readers should consult, however, Ockham's discussion in Ordinatio, Book I, d. 44, of divine omnipotence, divine ideas, and possibles.  It is a question that scholastics who commented on the Sentences knew well, and one that they understood constituted a major issue in the tradition.

My only caution about Longeway's commentary concerns his statements about connotative concepts and their relation to the categories other than substance and quality (pp. 373-374, n. 49, and p. 375, n. 56).  In trying to distinguish Ockham's from Aristotle's view, Longeway's comments invite the interpretation that Ockham regarded a quantity as a real thing apart from substance and quality.  Ockham regarded quantity as referring to a reality (a fact, if you will) but that it is not a thing apart from substance and quality.  As Longeway puts it correctly, substances and qualities are not the only realities, yet, I would add, for the sake of clarification, that a quantity is not a thing.  In fact, Longeway, it seems to me, interprets Ockham here in a way that makes more sense than the standard reductivist interpretations do.

The translation has an index of proper names, and of citations of authors.  There is no index of terms, but there is a 17-page glossary, which is far more useful than an index.  In sum, this is an outstanding introduction to and translation of Ockham's treatises on or related to the demonstrative syllogism.  The commentary is illuminating, especially in those cases where Longeway makes abundantly clear why Ockham thought that the causal powers of things and causal relations can be known only by experience, and why he maintained that qualities can have causal powers.  These views support Longeway's conclusion about Ockham as the founder of empiricism in the European tradition.